Materialism from Hobbes to Locke

Materialism From Hobbes To Locke

Stewart Duncan, Materialism from Hobbes to Locke, Oxford University Press, 2022, 233pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197613009.

Reviewed by Nicholas Jolley, University of California, Irvine


notre dame philosophical reviews

Stewart Duncan, Materialism from Hobbes to Locke, Oxford University Press, 2022, 233pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780197613009.

Reviewed by Nicholas Jolley, University of California, Irvine

Like most of his major philosophical doctrines, Hobbes’s materialism ignited a firestorm. Critics charged that the doctrine undermined the natural immortality of the soul and, at least when extended to God, was tantamount to atheism. Much of the criticism directed against Hobbes’s materialism was little more than vulgar abuse without real philosophical content. In his book, however, Stewart Duncan is concerned with showing that Hobbes’s doctrine also gave rise to a significant philosophical debate among his contemporaries and successors. Philosophers such as the Cambridge Platonists, Margaret Cavendish, and Locke raised serious difficulties about Hobbes’s arguments for materialism and questioned its ability to give an adequate account of mental states and processes.

Duncan’s cast of characters is worth pondering. No one will be surprised at the inclusion of the Cambridge Platonists, Henry More and Ralph Cudworth; they have long been familiar to readers as critics of Hobbes. The other two philosophers, Cavendish and Locke, however, may raise eyebrows in some quarters. Margaret Cavendish has only recently begun to attract the attention of historians of philosophy; unlike the Cambridge Platonists she is less an outright opponent of Hobbes than a philosopher who develops materialist themes in a panpsychist direction that has some affinities with Spinoza. Locke’s inclusion as one of the participants in the debate may cause surprise for a very different reason. For one, as Duncan observes, nothing in Locke’s initial characterization of his project in the Essay leads one to expect that materialism about the human mind will be a major topic of discussion; indeed, he tells the reader that he does not intend to ‘meddle with the physical consideration of the mind’ or ‘examine wherein its essence consists’ (I.i). Secondly, Locke is famous for his reluctance to refer explicitly to Hobbes with whose writings he claimed (disingenuously) to have little familiarity. Duncan argues convincingly, however, that Locke is able to engage with Hobbesian materialism with the help of resources derived from the Cambridge Platonists, especially Cudworth. Moreover, Duncan memorably shows how a knowledge of More’s writings, especially The Immortality of the Soul, can help settle controversies in Locke scholarship. In a remarkable section of his book, Duncan shows how one can appeal to More to refute Michael Ayers’s well-known thesis that attributing to Locke the idea of a bare substratum is ahistorical. As Duncan notes, More did not just consider the idea; he advocated it (120).

Duncan’s book is noteworthy not just for focusing on non-canonical figures such as Cavendish, but also for breaking new ground by illuminating the connections between the debate over materialism and other issues such as innate ideas. As Duncan notes, the issues of materialism and innate ideas may seem wholly unrelated to modern readers; it would seem that one’s stance on the one issue has no implications for one’s stance on the other. But as Duncan shows, this is not the way in which the philosophical situation appeared to seventeenth-century thinkers; it was widely believed that the immateriality of the mind was a necessary condition for innate ideas. Duncan is right to emphasize the connection between the two issues, but his treatment of the connection is not fully satisfactory. Duncan observes that if there is no innate mental content to explain, then an immaterial soul may be simply idling, and materialism can seem a possible option. But the case for those among Locke’s critics who argue that his denial of innate ideas threatens to introduce materialism is stronger if they can claim that an immaterial soul is a sufficient condition of the existence of innate ideas; Locke’s commitment to the falsity of an immaterialist theory of mind would then follow immediately by modus tollens. Duncan does not adduce evidence that Locke’s critics made such a damaging claim. Here he misses one relevant example in the period. In the New Essays on Human Understanding Leibniz’s spokesman complains that philosophers like Locke who hold that the mind is originally a tabula rasa ‘are treating it as fundamentally corporeal’ (II.1). In spite of this gap in his account Duncan’s emphasis on the connections between the two issues succeeds in throwing light on why the topic of innate ideas was debated with such violence by seventeenth-century philosophers. This is an issue that has often baffled historians of philosophy.

The last four chapters of the book are devoted to analyzing Locke’s complex stance towards materialism; here Duncan is concerned not only with Locke’s famous thinking-matter hypothesis, but also with his argument for the thesis that at least God must be an immaterial being. Duncan offers an intricate and illuminating analysis of the interpretative issues posed by the latter discussion; this analysis certainly advances the scholarly debate. In his analysis of the thinking-matter hypothesis Duncan helpfully distinguishes between voluntarist and non-voluntarist interpretations. The former reading would explain the presence of the faculty of thinking directly in terms of the actions of God; the latter would explain it in terms of underlying features of the material system (155). Duncan himself favors the voluntarist interpretation, and he is right at least to point out the problems posed by its rival according to which thought would be an emergent property of matter. For one thing, as Duncan shows, this interpretation is hard to square with the principles about perfections that Locke inherits from Cudworth. Further, on the non-voluntarist interpretation it is difficult to find a role for God to play in ‘superadding’ the faculty of thinking to matter—all the work seems to be done by the structure of the material system itself. Nonetheless, Locke does insist that his hypothesis concerns what God might superadd to matter that is ‘fitly disposed’, and this phrase suggests that matter has to be organized in a certain way to be capable of receiving the faculty of thinking; not even God, it seems, could superadd the faculty of thinking to a shoe or a turnip. Duncan may be right that the preponderance of the textual evidence favors a voluntarist reading, but there are also important considerations on the other side.

Duncan’s overall assessment of where Locke stands in the debate over materialism is a moderate and judicious one; he is not prepared to say that Locke inclines toward a materialist theory of the human mind, but he concedes that Locke regards it as a position worth serious consideration. Duncan’s caution here is admirable, but I think he underestimates the strengths of the case for saying that, despite his official agnosticism, Locke is committed to regarding materialism more favorably than substance dualism. In the first place, as Duncan concedes, Locke is clearly inclined to a materialist account of animal mentality. But if, as Locke argues, what distinguishes human minds from animal minds is simply the faculty of abstraction, it is difficult to see why this should require an ontological difference. Why should the fact that we have one cognitive faculty that animals lack compel us to say that our minds must be immaterial substances? Duncan claims, however, that Locke is committed to a continuous hierarchy from oysters to God; since Locke further holds that God is an immaterial mind, and that angels have such minds, there will have to be a difference of ontological kind somewhere in the hierarchy: ‘somewhere, an apparently small difference in perfections will have to match up to a difference in ontological kind’ (171). Why then, Duncan asks, should this difference not be located at the human/animal divide? Here Duncan surely exaggerates Locke’s commitment to continuity in the hierarchy. Some readers, like Lisa Downing, may wonder how seriously one should take Locke’s remarks about angels, but if one does take them seriously, one must recognize that their mental faculties could be vastly superior to ours. The transition from humans to angels would then be the most plausible location for the difference in ontological kind.

The other place where Duncan seems to me to underestimate the case for Locke’s materialist inclinations is in his discussion of the polemic against Descartes’ thesis that the mind always thinks. For Duncan, the relevance of Locke’s polemic for the debate over materialism lies simply in the fact that, in Locke’s eyes, Descartes is deducing a controversial thesis from a highly dubious metaphysical premise about the essence of the mind. In my view, Locke’s deceptively subtle and complex polemic against the Cartesian thesis seems designed to insinuate that non-reductive materialism is more philosophically satisfying than substance dualism. For Locke’s empirically-grounded claim that the mind thinks only intermittently is hard to reconcile with substance dualism. On the dualist view, there will be times when the mind is characterized only by bare powers, and for early modern philosophers this is not an attractive option. As Jonathan Bennett astutely noted many years ago, it is more philosophically satisfying on Lockean assumptions to suppose that our occurrent thoughts inhere in a material substance, namely the brain.

Arguably the four chapters on Locke constitute the philosophical heart of the book. But Duncan is perhaps best known through his published writings for his contributions to Hobbes scholarship, and he writes with notable authority in this area. Historians of philosophy have often wondered whether God falls within the scope of Hobbes’s materialism. Duncan argues convincingly that Hobbes moved from negative theology to an explicitly materialist theology that is found, for instance, in the Appendix to the Latin edition of Leviathan (1668).  The English edition of Leviathan (1651) may suggest that Hobbes is still committed to negative theology, but as Duncan argues, even here there are hints of the later view. Perhaps more interesting than the question of when Hobbes changed his mind is the question of why he did so. Negative theology was surely a more respectable position than materialist theology; if Hobbes had wished to minimize offence, he would have continued to advocate the former position, which has distinguished precedents within the tradition. But Hobbes in his old age seems to have been prepared to throw caution to the winds: witness, for instance, his bold and wholly gratuitous speculations about the Trinity in the Appendix to the Latin Leviathan. Perhaps the answer to the why question is suggested by Duncan’s observation that the seeds of materialist theology are already found in the English Leviathan. Hobbes may have come to realize that he could not consistently continue to defend his earlier negative theology.

Duncan’s book is a fascinating study of a major seventeenth-century debate that has not yet received all the attention it deserves. Although his interpretations are open to question in places, Duncan succeeds in illuminating a host of issues and figures, both canonical and non-canonical. The book is written with exceptional clarity and will be accessible to undergraduates and specialists alike; it should be read by anyone with a serious interest in early modern philosophy.