Mathematics and Its Applications, A Transcendental-Idealist Perspective

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Jairo José da Silva, Mathematics and Its Applications, A Transcendental-Idealist Perspective, Springer, 2017, 275pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783319630724.

Reviewed by Mirja Hartimo, University of Jyväskylä, Finland


Jairo José da Silva formulates a transcendental-idealist approach to mathematics. Appropriating (he is explicit about not engaging in any kind of exegesis) some central notions of Husserl's phenomenology, da Silva holds that mathematics is "intentionally posited" in the mathematical community, in communal work that has been carried out for centuries. "Intentional acts," such as intuiting or empty intending, put something with characteristic features and properties in front of the subject (28). If such positing is consistent, the intended object comes into existence (29). This allows viewing the existence of formal objects "on their own terms," as intentionally posited by the mathematicians. This leads da Silva to embrace a structuralist, and also Platonist, view of formal objects, corresponding not to metaphysical claims about mathematical reality, but to transcendental presuppositions of "how reality is conceived to be or how it must be given how it is conceived to be" (85). He applies the approach to numbers, sets, space, structures, and finally to physics, offering a rich and condensed array of insights, of which only a rough and approximate overview can be given here. After a brief summary of the contents of the book, I will offer some critical remarks.

Numbers come into existence by means of various kinds of intentional acts: e.g. intuitively through abstraction and ideation, but also in empty intendings, as in the process of naming them. They are intended to exist objectively, "out there," in principle for everyone to become conscious of them. They are quantitative forms "in the sense of being ideations of abstract quantitative aspects of collections of objects: by intending abstractly the elements of given collections as undifferentiated units, one is ipso facto intending this collection abstractly as a quantitative form, and ideally as a number" (107).

Numbers are also the object of inquiry for arithmetic, for which they come into existence in the practices of a community of arithmeticians. Since Dedekind, this community has not been particularly interested in numbers as the objects they are, but only in the abstract structure the domain of numbers instantiates. These structures are ideally singled out by categorical axiomatic systems (100-101). Generally, for da Silva, mathematical structuralism follows more from his emphasis on practice in mathematics rather than a close reading of Husserl's texts.

Like numbers, sets can exist intuitively, but also intentionally, constituted by "a set-constituting agent" in a "transcendental history," i.e., in the intentional acts from the basic perceptual experiences of constitution of empirical sets to the purely theoretical domain of mathematical sets and its theory (132-135). Da Silva elaborates on both empirical and mathematical sets and the role of the transcendental ego in their generation, thus providing many interesting insights to many aspects of set theory, including what he calls Cantor's "finitism," Gödel's constructible universe, and the axioms of ZFC (each of which is discussed individually). Ultimately, set theory relates to da Silva's structuralism as a context of representation for all mathematical structures (151).

Da Silva's approach to geometry follows the same pattern: he focuses on "the intentional genesis of our many representations of space, from the immediate space of sensations and perceptions to the idealized spaces of the mathematical science of empirical realty" (154). He then discusses a range of spaces and the idealizations involved in them: transcendent space, subjective sensorial-perceptual space, objective physical space, ideal mathematical-physical space, and finally purely formal mathematical spaces. He concludes, for example, that even if the mathematical representations of physical space were founded on perception, they do not represent physical space directly, but only a mathematical surrogate of it (182-183).

Da Silva's conception culminates in his discussion of his specific view of structuralism. He points out that, while he thinks that mathematical objects exist,

sometimes as intuitable objects, sometimes as purely intentional objects . . . since mathematical theories are capable of grasping only the formal structure of whatever structured systems of objects they purport to describe, mathematics is essentially a science of either instantiated or non-instantiated ideal abstract forms or structures. (191)

He distinguishes between abstract forms of structured systems, structures in re, and formal domains of categorical theories, i.e., what he calls structures de dicto. Whereas the former are given concretely, the latter are given abstractly (190; 199). Whereas, for the former, a complete structural description can be given, for the latter, theories positing them may fail to be their complete descriptions (second-order arithmetic being a standard example) (190). The latter notion, according to da Silva, "is a particularization of the Husserlian notion of formal domain" (202). Although structures express themselves in particular languages, "there are no privileged languages for structural descriptions, and certainly not first-order languages." Da Silva goes on to explain that phenomenology "considers mathematics as practiced independently of metaphysical idées reçues, and certainly no mathematician would seriously consider restricting mathematics to first-order languages" (204).

Structures can be taken as structured systems of formal objects. They are abstract, and their:

existence depends on the existence of other objects. Formal objects only exist in a system together with other formal objects, and systems of formal objects depend ontologically on either materially filled domains (to whose abstract structure they belong) or theories positing them as objective correlates. (205)

Da Silva explicitly claims that "formal objects of different structures are different objects" (205). He then goes on to explain different ways in which the structures can be interpreted in terms of other, typically richer, structures (206). Such interpretations also provide one way of accessing structures. Structures are generally accessible in many ways. For example, concrete structures can be accessed extensionally and intuitively (when the domains are small enough), or intensionally, by means of concepts. The abstract structures can be posited by means of theories. These structures can then be accessed, for example, through the above described interpretations. Da Silva also considers accessing them through the non-structural properties of the structural objects (213).

Structuralism, according to da Silva, also explains the applicability of mathematics. As in the case of geometry above, this is partly explained by the fact that the object of mathematical science is a mathematical surrogate of real nature (221). Inspired by Husserl, da Silva then considers the applicability of mathematics in science, where he finds it to play three different roles: representational, instrumental, and heuristic. In its representational role, mathematics is a provider of concepts with which the mathematical surrogate of perceptual reality and a language to describe it can be constructed. Examples of such concepts are the notions of 'entropy' and 'field.' New theoretical terms introduced to the theory can play a purely instrumental role in the theoretical investigation of some structured domain (232). Models can be used as heuristic devices (233). Da Silva then goes on to discuss several cases in more detail: Maxwell and displacement current; Dirac and antimatter; Pauli and the discovery of neutrino. (235-249).

In his conclusion, da Silva combats several theses held in philosophy of mathematics, such as Benacerraf's dilemma, the indispensability argument in favor of Platonism, and the "unreasonable effectiveness" of mathematics. He recapitulates his claim that mathematical objects exist, only not as Platonists believe they do. They exist as "bracketed," which da Silva identifies with withdrawal of ontological commitment (21; 259). This "bracketed existence" is granted to all objects whose positing is consistent (257). However, objects are not the primary focus of interest in mathematics; they serve mostly as supports of mathematical structure. This does not preclude mathematical objects also having non-structural properties. Da Silva concludes by explaining how his view is different from set-theoretical structuralism, ante rem structuralism, and in re structuralism.

Da Silva's work is simultaneously exciting and extremely aggravating: in its carefree departure from exegetical demands, it offers a forceful and interesting approach to many problems in philosophy of mathematics. It does this without situating the view within more recent debates, and with a tendency to polemic claims at the expense of charity and subtlety. At times this leads to inconsistencies: for example, his strong endorsement of the dependence thesis (i.e., that mathematical objects are dependent on each other or the structure to which they belong) contradicts his claim that "intentional existence" is granted to all objects whose positing is consistent. Indeed, I assume that his view would be more properly characterized as a compromise view of sorts, rather than as straightforward structuralism (cf. Linnebo 2008). Moreover, da Silva's polemic against, e.g., naturalists and other structuralists often builds on either slightly dated or uninteresting, caricatured interpretations of them. Furthermore, much of what he advances as new has already been stated in the literature, to which he does not refer. One keeps wondering what he would say about Stewart Shapiro's reformulation of his ante rem structuralism (2006), or, for example, the "thin realism" of  Penelope Maddy's "second philosophy" in Defending the Axioms (2011).

Da Silva's monograph is genuinely novel in defending mathematical structuralism on phenomenological grounds. (Husserl's views have been viewed as structuralist before by, e.g., Parsons 2008 and by Hartimo 2012, but not to the extent da Silva elaborates the view here.) But the question that arises is how phenomenological, or how close to Husserl's views, da Silva's approach is. I will dwell on this for the rest of this review.

Da Silva's appropriation agrees with the usual approaches to Husserl's phenomenology, in that it does not eliminate empirical reality or reduce it to a projection of the ego: the intentional objects are objects themselves, these objects are public objects, and the ego is an intersubjective, "intentional agent in general," in da Silva's words. But his account of the transcendental is not Husserlian. For example, to da Silva, the transcendental ego can "be a community of individuals working together across space and time as a single entity, building together, with maybe a variable sense of being, a domain of investigation (for example, mathematics)" (18). Indeed, most of the time da Silva identifies the transcendental ego with the historically developing mathematical community. According to da Silva's analysis, the transcendental ego posits intentional objects as objective in "intentional acts." The notion of "intentional positing" is da Silva's preferred term for the more usual 'constitution' (not distinguished from 'construction', e.g., on p.19, as I think it should) and seems to be identified with the activity of building together a domain of investigation. "Transcendental phenomenology" is then understood as a study of the necessary aspects of intentional positings under the action of the epoché (20). Epoché, in turn, "means taking intentional experiences on their own terms" (21), i.e., adopting an attitude of neutrality vis-à-vis intentional experiences.

On a closer inspection, da Silva's epoché (identified with phenomenological reduction, 21) appears to amount to a turn from reductive naturalism to a non-reductive version of it, rather than to transcendental phenomenology. Or better, to put it in terms used in philosophy of mathematics, da Silva's bracketing takes one from first-philosophy empiricism to second- philosophy Platonism or structuralism. According to da Silva, "transcendental phenomenological" thus really means "taking experiences on their own terms" (21), so that it is basically establishes the same as Shapiro's "faithfulness constraint" (2006). The resulting view of transcendental phenomenology is only remotely Husserlian, but da Silva probably does not care; he never claimed to be explicating Husserl's notions in the first place.

Nevertheless, da Silva's approach is a species of transcendental philosophy, thanks to his interesting discussion of the transcendental presuppositions of the logical principles of reasoning. This cashes out in practice what the transcendental means to da Silva. It means that the mathematicians' research is guided by few fundamental presuppositions that show that, to them, the world is necessarily a meaningful, experienceable one; thus, these principles delimit the boundaries of reality (83). Instead of amounting to a metaphysical claim about how reality is, they are presuppositions on "how reality is conceived to be or how it must be given how it is conceived to be" (85).

From this anthropologized transcendental idealist approach, da Silva derives a view of mathematics that, ironically, contrary to his own view, I find to be extremely faithful to Husserl. Husserl is a structuralist (a thin ante rem structuralist, to be more specific), thanks to the central role of the concept of 'definite manifold' in his account. Definite manifolds are domains of categorical and syntactically complete theories that Husserl presents as an ideal that mathematicians were pursuing at his time. Da Silva has previously vehemently disagreed with such a view of definite manifolds (see Hartimo 2016, and the references therein). Here, he concedes that "Husserl, however, may have presupposed that something like categoricity and logical completeness were attainable ideals" (63) and acknowledges that:

Husserl's typology of logic, which reserved a domain for the study of formal domains and logical relations among them side by side with the logical investigation of formal theories and their mutual relations . . . seems adequate to accommodate a structuralist perspective on mathematics. (101)

Da Silva's primary justification for his mathematical structuralism derives from his view of phenomenology as an approach that takes its subject matter "on its own terms," and the consequent emphasis of mathematical practice.

To conclude, da Silva's approach is exciting in many respects. Its account of various kinds of idealizations at work in formal sciences is extensive and rich; its connection to Husserl is somewhat arbitrary, but nevertheless it offers an elaborate and interesting transcendental idealist addition to the extant philosophies of mathematics.


Hartimo, Mirja. (2012). "Husserl's Pluralistic Phenomenology of Mathematics," Philosophia Mathematica 20. 86-110.

Hartimo, Mirja. (2016). "Husserl on completeness, definitely," Synthese. DOI:10.1007/s11229-016-1278-7.

Linnebo, Øystein. (2008) "Structuralism and the Notion of Dependence," Philosophical Quarterly 58: 59-79.

Maddy, Penelope. (2011). Defending the Axioms. On the Philosophical Foundations of Set Theory. Oxford University Press.

Parsons, Charles. (2008). Mathematical Thought and its Objects. Cambridge University Press.

Shapiro, Stewart. (2006). "Structure and Identity." In Identity and Modality, edited by Fraser MacBride, Clarendon. 109-145.