Mathematics and Reality

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Mary Leng, Mathematics and Reality, Oxford University Press, 2010, 278pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199280797.

Reviewed by Gregory Lavers, Concordia University


In Mathematics and Reality, Mary Leng outlines and defends a version of mathematical fictionalism that proceeds by attacking indispensability arguments (from confirmation holism to mathematical realism). Leng is primarily concerned to show that our use of mathematics as applied in the physical sciences does not require us to believe in mathematical objects. The book treats of much that is of interest to contemporary philosophers of mathematics. Leng discusses philosophical views of John Burgess, Rudolf Carnap, Hartry Field, Paul Horwich, Penelope Maddy, Hilary Putnam, W.V.O. Quine, Bas van Fraassen, and Stephen Yablo, among others.

The work is divided into ten chapters. The first is an introductory chapter where Leng discusses the indispensability argument for mathematical realism. Here Leng announces her strategy to undermine the argument by attacking the assumption of confirmation holism. Chapter two discusses Leng's naturalistic approach to ontology, which she applies in the rest of the book. Chapter three is a discussion of the prospects for Field's project. Leng argues that whether Field's program can be successfully carried out does not affect the form of fictionalism that she wishes to defend. Chapter four discusses naturalism and its relation to mathematics. It should be noted that this chapter contains a discussion of pure mathematics. Leng holds that pure mathematics poses no special problems for the naturalistic anti-realist, since it can be seen as the investigation of the consequences of certain propositions without regard to their truth. The book as a whole then, deals primarily with applied mathematics.

Chapter five deals with idealizations in science and the problems these pose for the confirmation holist. Chapter six concerns the question of demarcating those sentences in natural science that we should see as expressing literal truths from those to be understood as mere analogies. Chapter seven discusses Kendall Walton's views on fiction as make-believe, and explains how they can be applied to the cases of idealizations in science and mathematical objects. In both cases Leng argues that they should be understood on the model of prop-oriented (as opposed to content-oriented) make-believe. That is, both are to be seen as metaphorical claims that nonetheless manage to tell us something about actual things. Chapter eight is a discussion of the relation between Leng's mathematical fictionalism and constructive empiricism. Chapter nine discusses the problem of how a fictionalist can account for the success of mathematics. Finally, chapter ten presents a brief conclusion.

Leng's book, as mentioned, is a defense of mathematical fictionalism. Defense is used here in a more literal sense than is usual when describing a book. Often what is called a defense of position X will really be an argument that position X is the position that one ought to hold. This is not the case with Leng's book (with the exception of one paragraph towards the end of the final chapter). Leng's goal is to show that there is a coherent form of fictionalism (distinct from Field's) that can be defended against various objections. It is not an argument that this is the position that one ought to adopt. Leng, in fact, is explicit about this in the concluding chapter:

But what I have not, so far, argued is that our reflective understanding of the role of mathematical hypotheses in our theories rules out taking a realist attitude to those hypotheses, and viewing them as assertions of truths about the relations between really existing mathematical and non-mathematical objects. And if mathematical platonism is not ruled out by our understanding of the role of mathematics in empirical science, then it seems that the most we can conclude is that adopting a broadly naturalist approach to ontology requires us to be agnostic about the question of whether there are mathematical objects. (p. 259)

This point is made with fewer than three full pages of the book remaining. But Leng, surprisingly, is not ready to rest content with this as her conclusion. She decides to turn her argument, as made so far, into an argument against platonism. She does not, however, devote all of the remaining space to this. Actually, she devotes just one paragraph to establishing the untenability of platonism. The paragraph consists of an appeal to Ockham's razor and a quotation of Field's where he is talking of little green men who live on electrons. I can't see this argument convincing anyone who does not already reject platonism.

Leng begins addressing the topic of ontology with a discussion of Carnap and Quine. At various points in the text she states that the ontological issues she is dealing with trace back to this famous debate. Given the emphasis she places on this debate, Leng could have been more careful in outlining the positions. She describes Carnap's position in 'Empiricism, Semantics and Ontology' as the view that, for instance, to use the framework of arithmetic is to speak as if there are numbers (see pp. 30, 32, 33, 134). This 'as if ' makes Carnap himself sound like a fictionalist. Quine interpreted Carnap as holding the view that talk of abstract entities was a mere manner of speaking, but this was not Carnap's view. Leng summarizes Carnap's position by saying "merely practical reasons to speak as if there are φs do not count as reasons to believe there are φs." (p. 134) Carnap does not think it is possible to believe there are, for instance, numbers, if this is meant in the sense of the external question concerning the existence of number. Nor would Carnap hold that using the framework of arithmetic is merely speaking as if there are numbers.

Quine plays a more prominent role in Leng's book than Carnap does. However, beyond the points of explicitly acknowledged disagreement between Quine and Leng, there is another that deserves mention. Quine, like Carnap, thought the metaphysical question of the existence of a certain type of thing was meaningless (see Quine, 1976, p. 203). Quine replaces the traditional metaphysical question of what exists with the question of what entities are within the domain of discourse of our best scientific theories. Quine, of course, disagrees with Carnap in holding that the existential commitments of a theory are a matter of justification and not a mere practical consideration. But if we have evidence for a theory that quantifies over a certain type of entity, this is not in turn evidence that that type of entity exists in some absolute metaphysical sense. Quine has replaced the traditional metaphysical question of existence, which he sees as meaningless, with the question of what our best theories quantify over.

Leng argues that in the case of idealizations in science, as well as with mathematical existence assumptions, we should not read our ontological assumptions off of the range of our quantifiers. In the case of some of the things in the range of our quantifiers, the best attitude we could take towards them is that they are fictional. So, on Leng's view we are committed to those elements in our domain of discourse that we have direct evidence for. You can't be an anti-realist about electrons because "you can't spray fictions!" (p. 149) But now it becomes important to distinguish those entities that we have direct evidence for from those that can be seen as mere fictions. Leng does this by appeal to inference to the best explanation. If we cannot explain the success of the theory on the assumption that a kind of entity does not exist, then we are committed to that kind of entity. But now notice that Leng, unlike Quine, can no longer be said to have given a new meaning to the question of ontology. For to engage in the project that Leng outlines we need to already know what it is for something to exist (as well as what types of things are explained by this). Whereas Quine's redefinition of the problem of ontology does not presuppose a prior understanding of existence, Leng's does. Many philosophers working today would not see this as a problem, but given the stressed Quinean/Carnapian roots of her project, and the claim to have forged an intermediary position, this difference between Leng and both Carnap and Quine seems worthy of mention.

Let us move on, then, to the question of what, if any, ontological commitments a fictionalist need make with respect to elements of the fiction. One would expect a book devoted to the question of mathematical ontology, defending a fictionalist answer, to take very seriously the problem of the possible (unacknowledged) ontological commitments of fictions. After all, if fictions involve commitment to fictional objects, that is, abstract objects of sorts, then the recourse to fictionalism is obvious futility. Leng's position is that this problem has been given a completely satisfactory solution by Kendall Walton. Walton's view is that talk of fictional things occurs in the context of make-believe (or pretence) and that "insofar as statements appearing to be about fictional entities are uttered in pretence, they do not introduce metaphysical mysteries." (Walton, 1990, p. 396) Leng, in defending the view that we can avoid ontological commitments to both idealizations in science as well as indispensable mathematical objects, presents (rather than argues for) Walton's view and then says the following:

For those who take idealizations to be significantly different from fictions, or who think that there is no hope for an anti-realist account of fictions and fictional characters, the remainder of the discussion will do little to move them to an anti-realist view of mathematics. My aim in what follows is, rather, to persuade those who do take it to be plausible that ordinary scientific modelling should be viewed as analogous to fiction-making, and that fiction-making does not introduce commitment to an ontology of fictional characters, that the use of mathematics in the empirical sciences should be understood along the same lines. (p. 171)

Up to this point Leng's book has mainly sought to undermine Quine's argument from confirmation holism to realism concerning everything in our domain of quantification. This is done, primarily, by showing that idealizations in science introduce more problems than Quine thought, and they cannot all be dealt with as Quine proposed. But here we see, with most of the argumentative steps towards a defense of mathematical fictionalism left to be made, Leng asserts that the book will constitute no more than this for those who reject either of these claims:

1) idealizations are analogous to fictions,

2) fictions make no ontological demands.

I for one, having serious doubts about the second of these claims, felt a little shortchanged by this argumentative move on Leng's part.

Chapter eight of Leng's book closes with an interesting discussion of Horwich (1991), which poses a certain problem for any form of instrumentalism. The problem is that we can be mistaken in our beliefs about what we really believe. Following van Fraassen, one might hold that it is best to merely accept, rather than believe, our best scientific theories. But given that we can be wrong about what it is that we believe, it is up to the instrumentalist to show that there is some real difference between thinking one merely accepts a theory (while actually believing it) and genuinely only accepting it. In the case of fictionalism versus platonism, the problem is to specify the difference between really being a fictionalist versus actually being a platonist who is mistaken in taking oneself to be a fictionalist. Leng, however, holds that "adopting the attitude of fictionalism makes no difference to one's ability to immerse oneself in the practices of modern science." (p. 210) So other than how they understand their own position, there is no difference in the dispositions or practices of the fictionalist and platonist that would show that one merely acts as if there are numbers while the other really believes there are numbers. Such an attitude comes close to claiming, as Howard Stein put it, that "between a cogent and enlightened 'realism' and a sophisticated 'instrumentalism' there is no significant difference -- no difference that makes a difference." (Stein, 1989, p. 61) Of course, one can't accept Stein's conclusion and still maintain that one is, nonetheless, in some important respect, a fictionalist.

The fictionalist seems, therefore, to be in a quite difficult position here. The position Leng announces at the end of this chapter is that there are two ways out for the fictionalist. On the one hand she states that it might simply be implausible, despite Horwich's claims, that diehard platonists or fictionalists are wrong in the self-descriptions of their attitudes. In this case, despite the problem posed by Horwich, fictionalism is defensible. Leng's argument here appears to have the form: the basic assumptions of my opponent's view might be mistaken, and since I want only to show that my view can be defended, nothing more needs to be shown. Fortunately, however, Leng sees another way out for the fictionalist that she develops in more detail. Her strategy is to turn Horwich's argument around. Horwich suggests that if his challenge cannot be met, the instrumentalist might actually, despite protests to the contrary, hold a realist position. Leng's strategy is to show that if there is no difference that makes a difference between the various dispositions and practices of realists and fictionalists, it might be the case that both are best viewed as fictionalists. She does this by pointing to respects in which mathematics is analogous to a game of make-believe. For instance, she claims, we can make further stipulations as we go along (e.g., we can define the natural numbers as the finite Zermelo ordinals). Also, mathematics permits a certain amount of indeterminacy (e.g., whether the natural numbers are identical to any particular ω-sequence is indeterminate).

But even if we grant to Leng that mathematics is analogous to make-believe in these ways, it seems that such a move cannot be made in defense of fictionalism against Horwich's challenge. If, contra Horwich, it is the platonists who despite their protests are really fictionalists, then this is as much a problem for fictionalists as it is for platonists. This is because fictionalists require it to be possible to be both platonists and fictionalists. After all, the fictionalists act as though (or make-believe) platonism is true. If it were impossible to actually be a platonist, then there would be no possible belief for the fictionalist to treat as true.

Globally, I think the book could have done more to convince people not already leaning towards fictionalism. Although I found that at some crucial points further argument was really needed, there is much of interest in this book. What I have commented on is what I thought stood out most, and of course there are many discussions in the book that I have not touched on at all. Mathematical fictionalism is now a very popular subject, and I am sure that this book will generate a considerable amount of interest.


Horwich, P. (1991). On the nature and norms of theoretical commitment. Philosophy of Science, 58 (1), 1-14.

Quine, W. V. O. (1976). The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays. Harvard University Press, revised and enlarged edition.

Stein, H. (1989). Yes but . . . some skeptical remarks on realism and anti-realism. Dialectica , 43 (1), 47-65.

Walton, K. L. (1990). Mimesis as Make-Believe. Harvard University Press.