Mathematics and Scientific Representation

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Christopher Pincock, Mathematics and Scientific Representation, Oxford University Press, 2012, 330pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199757107.

Reviewed by Juha Saatsi, University of Leeds


Mathematics and Scientific Representation is an engaging piece of contemporary philosophy of mathematics and science. Its deeply science-informed approach and focus on applied mathematics, with an aim to seriously tackle also more traditional issues in philosophy of mathematics, exemplify exciting and fertile scholarly 'border-hopping'. Fourteen chapters contribute to a broad range of live debates surrounding mathematics' role in science, and the book's riches provide much for a reviewer to go into -- in a good way. Pincock weaves together interesting ideas about the nature of scientific realism, representations, models, idealizations, explanation, concepts, and confirmation, just to name a few that fall within the customary purview of general philosophy of science.

Pincock's primary aspirations are twofold. On the one hand, he wants to anatomize how (and why) mathematics actually works in scientific representations. On the other hand, he wishes to provide a measure of support to the realist side of the perennial debate between realism vs. anti-realism regarding mathematics. To be precise, Pincock supports only realism about the truth-values of mathematical claims (as opposed to Platonism), by arguing that our best account of mathematics' role in science involves the assumption that we have substantial a priori mathematical knowledge. After providing an overview of the book I will mostly focus on the latter aspiration, but I should say at the outset that in my view Pincock succeeds equally well on both counts.

Pincock sets himself a "central challenge: to account for the contributions of mathematics to the success of science." Answering this challenge is significant in its own right, of course, but it also promises to shed new light on various philosophical issues revolving around mathematics' indispensability to science. For, as Pincock convincingly argues, much of the extant discussion of those issues has been too coarse-grained; some influential old arguments are undermined by a more fine-grained approach that provides interesting new perspectives.

The material divides quite naturally into two halves. The first half, Part I, examines mathematics' 'epistemic contributions' to science that

include aiding in the confirmation of the accuracy of a given representation through prediction and experimentation. But they extend further into considerations of calibrating the content of a given representation to the evidence available, making an otherwise irresolvable problem tractable, and offering crucial insights into the nature of physical systems. (p. 8)

Part II provides a more miscellaneous and meandering discussion of various topics surrounding these contributions, ranging from mathematics' role in scientific discovery and (inference to the best) explanation, to worries about fictionalism, to the nature of physical and mathematical concepts.

In Part I Pincock distinguishes five different types of epistemic contributions on the basis of detailed scientific examples. There are interesting illustrations of 'concrete causal', 'abstract acausal',and 'abstract varying' representations, to name the first three. In each case mathematics makes an epistemic contribution by bringing out features of the system that are relevant for our evidential assessment of the representation's accuracy. For example, in abstract acausal representations mathematics functions to capture pertinent non-causal features by ignoring causal detail. In abstract varying representations, on the other hand, mathematics captures abstract similarities between different types of systems, so that evidential considerations regarding one type of system can be brought to bear on the confirmation of the representation's accuracy in relation to the other type of system.

Throughout the book Pincock's analysis is heavily informed by actual scientific models. For instance, in chapter 5 the reader is treated to no less than nine scientific examples that serve to bring out the multiple senses in which mathematics can contribute to the specification of an appropriate 'scale' of a representation for a given phenomenon. ('Scale' concerns the relative magnitudes of the quantities involved.) Scale representations form the fourth broad type of epistemic contribution. The fifth type of contribution, following Friedman (in Dynamics of Reason, 2001), pertains to mathematics' role in setting 'constitutive frameworks'.

An overarching lesson of Part I is that at a finer grain of detail mathematics can be seen to contribute to the empirical success of science in numerous, rather distinct ways. Some significant unifying themes emerge, however. One is that empirical success in science is often borne out of the ability to selectively zoom in on some pertinent aspects of the world vis-à-vis a phenomenon of interest. Such selective representation is often required in order to either achieve tractability by avoiding unmanageable underlying complexity, or to gain knowledge of higher-level features by avoiding commitment to some epistemically inaccessible lower-level state of affairs. Pincock's analysis brings out how mathematics indispensably functions -- in various ways -- in obtaining such selective representations.

Another noteworthy theme is that mathematics' contribution to science can arguably often be analyzed in terms of confirmation. That is, mathematics aids 'in the confirmation of the accuracy of a given representation through prediction and experimentation', and 'in calibrating the content of a given representation to the evidence available'. (p. 8)

Finally, in Pincock's analysis mathematics' contribution is uniformly dissected in structural terms: the representational content of mathematical scientific representations can always be characterised 'in terms of broadly structural relationships between physical situations and mathematical structures'. (p. 16)

What, then, is the exact role played by mathematics vis-à-vis confirmation? One might think that mathematics' capacity to boost confirmation, whilst indispensable, is always derivative: it is dependent on mathematics' successfully functioning as a vehicle of representation. According to this view, any boost in confirmation is primarily due to the representation's latching onto appropriate features of the (non-mathematical) world -- features specified at the right level of abstraction or specificity -- relative to the phenomenon in question. What mathematics does -- all it does -- is give the means to represent the relevant features of the (non-mathematical) world. One might think, furthermore, that such a representational role can be accommodated equally readily by mathematical realists and anti-realists alike.

This is not what Pincock thinks. He thinks that (thoroughgoing) mathematical anti-realists have a harder time capturing mathematics' epistemic contributions. The notion that the content of mathematical representations is structural leaves a fair bit of leeway for acceptable realist accounts of pure mathematics. (Basically, 'any account of pure mathematics that agrees with the Platonist on the structural relations of the mathematical entities will be adequate'. (p. 26) This includes, for example, Lewis's and Hellman's nominalist views.) However, mathematical fictionalists, who give up realism even about the truth-values of mathematical claims, arguably do not have the wherewithal to extract non-mathematical representational content from scientific representations.

[The] challenge [for the fictionalists] is to provide rules that will indicate, for a given context, which claims can be extracted from the fiction and taken literally as claims about the actual world. My argument is that this challenge cannot be met because any set of rules that are detailed enough to do the job will presuppose knowledge of the actual world that we do not have. (p. 252)

I find Pincock's argument unconvincing. This is partly because it seems out of tune with his own account of representational content. The latter presupposes the ability to refer to physical properties and relations that can be construed as so structured as to stand in a (structural) relationship to some relevant mathematical structure(s). (According to Pincock the content of any given mathematical scientific representation is given by the specification of (i) a mathematical structure, (ii) non-mathematical properties and relations in question, and (iii) the structural relation that obtains between the (i) and (ii).) Pincock's argument against fictionalism, on the other hand, turns on the alleged inability to specify the relevant non-mathematical properties and relations needed to fix the (non-mathematical) representational content (cf. 'knowledge of the actual world that we do not have', in the quote above). There's clearly some tension here. Furthermore, ultimately it is simply unclear to me how it matters at all for the representational purpose whether claims about the mathematical structure are true simpliciter, instead of merely true in the fiction of mathematics, if we assume (as Pincock does) that it makes sense to talk about a non-mathematical system 'instantiating structure' (relative to the specification of properties and relations), so that we can talk about a (structural) relation between that system and a mathematical structure.

Pincock's critical assessment of mathematical fictionalism is but a small section of Part II. But a lot hinges on it. For example, he argues that only a priori justified pure mathematics can contribute to the success of science. The argument turns heavily on the alleged failure of fictionalism. (Cf. §10.3) And towards the very end Pincock laments the lack of an adequate epistemology for a priori justified mathematics, saying that it 'is a significant cost of [his] proposal for making sense of how mathematics helps in science.' (p. 287) A fictionalist could avoid this cost, of course.

In Part II Pincock also puts forward a novel point of view on the indispensability argument. He begins by providing a very nice exposition of the argument, its roots and its variants, arguing that the most defensible form of the argument, in light of mathematics' epistemic contribution to science, is one that only supports realism in truth-value (as opposed to Platonism). The argument turns on his structural conception of representational content and the idea that in order to account for mathematics' epistemic contributions one only needs to be able to capture correctly the representational content. Pincock argues, convincingly, that one does not need a Platonist interpretation of mathematics to achieve this, as various other forms of mathematical realism will do. (And, in my view, fictionalism would do as well.) He also puts forward a strong novel criticism of Field's error-theoretic account of mathematics: Field-type nominalizations require very specific 'micro-level' assumptions about space-time, say, that go well beyond our wherewithal to confirm our best scientific representations that often are the best exactly by virtue of being selective and abstracting away from such 'micro-level' assumptions.

Some recent debates on the indispensability argument have brought to the fore one (broadly) epistemic contribution of mathematics that goes beyond a structural representational role: explanation. Most of the debate on the 'explanatory indispensability argument' has focused on what has been viewed as the critical question: are there any genuine mathematical explanations of physical phenomena? Pincock's position here is interesting, for he answers 'yes' to this question, but nevertheless denies the force of the argument. I have some worries about both sides of Pincock's position.

Pincock's reasoning to the existence of genuine mathematical explanations is quite straightforward. Take an explanation that involves a mathematical concept or theorem. Remove that bit of mathematics. See if the remainder is still explanatory, or explanatory in the same degree. If not, you have a mathematical explanation. I, for one, am happy agree that we can choose to describe such an explanation as 'mathematical', since there is sense in which the explanation is mathematical. But this is unhelpful in the context of the indispensability argument, for what matters in this context is whether or not mathematics contributes to an explanation in a way that is suitably linked to ontological commitment. That is, what matters is not only whether or not mathematics is indispensable to providing  the explanation, but whether it is indispensable to the explanation's explanatory power. Although Pincock does present the indispensability argument in terms of latter, in my view his affirmative reasoning to the existence of mathematical explanations fails to forge an adequate connection between the notion that mathematics is indispensable to explaining, and the assertion that mathematics is a source of explanatory power. (This connection is difficult to establish in the virtual absence of any analysis of 'explanatory power'). The issue isn't merely terminological, for in the context of the indispensability argument one would do well to use 'mathematical explanation' in a suitably demanding way, to ensure that there is an appropriate connection to realism and ontological commitment.

Despite viewing mathematics as genuinely explanatory, Pincock denies the force of the explanatory indispensability argument because he thinks that the realist is only justified in a restricted principle of inference to the best explanation.

A claim which appears in an explanation can receive support via IBE only when the explanatory contribution tells against some relevant alternative epistemic possibilities. (p. 214)

According to Pincock one cannot infer from a given mathematical explanation to the mathematical claim C involved in the explanation, if (i) it is possible to replace C with some strictly weaker claim C' without loss in explanatory power, and (ii) it is an epistemic possibility for some agent that only C' is true. Arguably (i) and (ii) hold for all paradigmatic examples of mathematical explanation, undermining a realist argument from those examples to the truth of the mathematical claims involved.

Consider, for example, Baker's proposal that some theorems concerning prime numbers are explanatory in biology. According to the proposal, a claim concerning prime numbers, 'prime periods minimize intersections', is indispensable to our best explanations of cicada periods. (p. 205) Now consider replacing C with weaker C': 'all primes less than 100 minimize intersections'. From the perspective of our best theory of natural numbers C' is an arbitrary restriction, but Pincock invites us to adopt the perspective of an agent who has not yet committed to our best theory of natural numbers, for whom it is an epistemic possibility that there are no prime numbers bigger than 100. Pincock argues that for such a sceptical agent C could be replaced with C' without a loss in explanatory power (given that the actual cicada periods, 13 and 17, are both less than 100). Hence, there is no IBE support for C.

This is an interesting move and there is much to be said about it. One thing worth flagging outright is how restrictive Pincock's principle seems to be. Although I won't argue for this here, it seems to rule out typical IBEs that some scientific realists take to support our best high-level theories, because such theories can often be replaced with a weaker explanans the content of which falls much short of the theory as a whole. Even if such a replacement is quite arbitrary and unmotivated from the theory's perspective, for a sceptic who has not yet accepted the theory it is an epistemic possibility that only the weaker explanans is true. So, by Pincock's lights, the theory on the whole cannot enjoy any justification deriving from its explanatory success. This 'anti-holistic' viewpoint goes against the view that a theory -- the whole theory -- with appropriate theoretical virtues can enjoy a degree of confirmation by virtue of furnishing us with a good explanation.

Although I have some sympathy with Pincock's anti-holist attitude, I'm not sure how hard his line of attack on the Quinean bites. The explanatory indispensability argument tries to show that scientific realist commitments (suitably construed) can extend to purely mathematical claims. But it's not clear that Pincock's restriction on IBE manages to draw any principled line between mathematical and non-mathematical commitments; rather, it should be viewed as aiming to undermine some of the general realist presuppositions that underlie the indispensability argument. This changes the terms of the debate. Given the new terms, there may be room for the Quinean opponent to respond by first defending, on general grounds, the kinds of theoretical virtues that some realists like to relate to confirmation in connection with our best scientific explanations. Then the opponent could claim that number theory has those kinds of theoretical virtues, or even that the move from number theory (and the relevant theorem, corresponding to C) to C' results in a loss of explanatory power, because C' appears to be an unexplained explainer unless accounted for in general number theoretic terms. (An alternative line of criticism on the explanatory indispensability argument would be to question mathematics' contribution to explanatory power in the first place. Cf. Saatsi, 2011.)

These question marks take nothing away from the fact that the book is a great contribution to the field. It exemplifies a fruitful naturalistic perspective throughout, and offers an excellent (if sometimes technically demanding) reading for anyone interested in how mathematics contributes to science.[1]


Saatsi, Juha. 2011. "The enhanced indispensability argument: representational vs. explanatory role of mathematics in science." British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 62: 143-54.

[1] Thanks to Chris Pincock for helpful discussions and comments.