Mathematics, Ideas and the Physical Real

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Albert Lautman, Mathematics, Ideas and the Physical Real, Simon B. Duffy (tr.), Continuum, 2011, 310pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441123442.

Reviewed by Anastasios Brenner, Université Paul Valéry-Montpellier III


Albert Lautman, whose writings are translated into English for the first time here, was a French philosopher of the first half of the twentieth century. He drew on the philosophically informed mathematical works of Poincaré, while taking into account the German school represented by Hilbert as well as his predecessor Riemann. Like Sartre and Aron, he studied under Léon Brunschvicg, whose main area of interest lay in the history and philosophy of mathematics. Lautman had close contacts with two other mathematically inclined philosophers of the same generation, Jacques Herbrand and Jean Cavaillès. Aside from Herbrand, known for the eponymous theorem, these thinkers are not even mentioned in a major reference work such as Routledge's Encyclopedia of Philosophy. A whole school of French philosophy of mathematics has thus been neglected. After a promising start with the publication of several texts revealing his philosophical ingenuity and the breadth of his mathematical knowledge, Lautman's promising career was cut short when, because of his involvement in the Resistance, he was arrested and shot by the Nazis.

Simon Duffy's translation follows the French edition of collected works, first published in 1977 and reissued with some additional texts in 2006. The writings are given in chronological order, beginning with a short piece "Considerations on Mathematical Logic", dating from 1933, up until the posthumous "Symmetry and Dissymmetry in Mathematics and Physics" of 1946. The translator has considerably expanded the bibliography, completing abridged references, listing English editions of the works cited and mentioning recent publications relating to Lautman. There is a risk, however, that today's reader may get lost. Rather than following the chronological order, it would be advisable to start with what constitutes Lautman's major contribution, his main dissertation "Essay on the Notions of Structure and Existence in Mathematics". Strangely enough, this is placed after the complementary dissertation. Let us not forget that a candidate for the doctorate was required at the time to present two dissertations. The complementary dissertation, which had replaced the Latin thesis, was generally conceived as a commentary or case study. Lautman's "Essay on the Unity of the Mathematical Sciences in their Current Development" falls into the former category.

Furthermore, the division of the volume into four books is somewhat disturbing; these are self‑contained works. The two dissertations answer to the precise academic requirements of the time. Characteristically, Lautman followed these up three years later with a sequel, "New Research on the Dialectical Structure of Mathematics", in which he developed more freely his mathematical realism, calling on the work of Heidegger, whom he had recently discovered. Finally, he left the posthumous text on symmetry mentioned above, which extended his investigations into the field of mathematical physics. The earlier texts as well as the letter to the mathematician Maurice Fréchet are of a different nature. We have summaries of presentations given at congresses, an account of the proceedings of one such congress as well as programmatic papers. These texts indeed throw some light on Lautman's research program, but it would be better to read them afterwards. What then is lacking here is a thematic organization and historical contextualization.

The translator obviously made an effort to render in English Lautman's particular style, drawing both on mathematical language and philosophical discourse. He has checked authorized translations for cited passages and provided some explanatory notes. Nevertheless, the translation is often too literal. Some choices call for an explanation: for example, "épistémologie" can of course be transposed as epistemology, but it should be added that in French usage the term refers to philosophy of science and not theory of knowledge (pp. 22, 199). Moreover, it would be interesting to know how this specialty was understood in France, that is, outside the sphere of influence of logical positivism. On this issue, I fear we encounter a slip in the translation : when Lautman criticizes logical positivism, I read him as saying "the critique of contemporary science as a whole [and not the translator's "any criticism of contemporary science"] shows the philosophical weakness of such an attitude" (p. 191; cf. p. 1). Lautman is referring to generally received conceptions in French philosophy of science as transmitted by Duhem, Poincaré and Brunschvicg. A few lines below, in speaking of progress in mathematics, Lautman writes that "reality has become so abstract that the scientist has the impression of finding himself merely confronted with his own mind" and not the translator's "the impression of no longer ever happening to be in front of their own mind".

Although Lautman was intent on formulating a philosophy of mathematics, thus giving importance to formal methods in philosophy, he objected to the program of logical positivism or logical empiricism. He focused mainly of the doctrines of Carnap and Reichenbach. His criticism was leveled at two claims: the tautological character of mathematics and the observational‑theoretical dichotomy. Against these claims Lautman asserted both the creativity of mathematics and its content or substance. He generally questioned any strict separations: form and matter, abstract and concrete, theory and fact, etc. Lautman emphasized the dual nature of mathematical entities or beings, this duality providing a clue to their impact on the world.

His examination is often penetrating. He pointed out the differences between the Vienna Circle and their sources (Russell, Wittgenstein and Hilbert), the changes in their program as well as the discrepancies between their claims and their results. As he put it "the logicists of the Vienna Circle always assert their full agreement with Hilbert's school. Nothing is however more debatable" (p. 10). And he went on to reveal in detail the disagreements with Hilbert, an author he himself closely followed. Lautman thus brought out the tendencies of this movement: "integral positivism", "extreme formalism", "radical nominalism". What Lautman most objected to was the reductionism he perceived in logical positivism.

In its place, Lautman proposed a conception that combines realism and rationalism. It should be understood that he was elaborating on a general trend in French thought. Since the beginning of the twentieth century there had been a revolt against Aristotelianism, which had dominated earlier philosophy. Several thinkers had defended the relevance of Platonism to science: Gaston Milhaud, Léon Robin, Léon Brunschvicg, followed by Gaston Bachelard and Alexandre Koyré. Lautman was part of this movement; he called on Platonism in an endeavor to grasp the essential question of the relation of mathematics to the world. As he states in his presentation to the International Congress of Philosophy held in 1937:

We . . . wish to indicate here the Platonic conclusion that these researches seem to us to impose: the reality inherent to mathematical theories comes to them from their participation in an ideal reality that is dominating with respect to mathematics, but that is only knowable through it. (p. 30)

Lautman expressly employs here the singular "la mathématique"; he is referring to the various branches of mathematics as a whole. What Lautman was proposing was not a philosophy of mathematics, that is, a discourse on mathematics from an external point of view, but rather a mathematical philosophy, that is, a critical analysis from an internal point of view. This is in keeping with the French tradition: both Auguste Comte and Brunschvicg preferred to call what they were doing mathematical philosophy.

Lautman in returning to Plato called on a group of historians of philosophy, presented as giving the most authoritative interpretation: Léon Robin, Julius Stenzel and Oscar Becker. He was of course again pushing his point. These scholars based their interpretation on a reconstruction of Plato's oral teachings. To be sure, this was an influential but controversial line of interpretation. Lautman was seeking to relate his conception of contemporary mathematics to the history of philosophy. Becker, in one passage, is associated with Husserl and Heidegger; his views are connected with Brouwer's intuitionism. One senses what Lautman was after. For him, Hilbert's formalism should not be interpreted in nominalistic terms, and Lautman attempted to reconcile this perspective with a certain form of realism. To what extent Hilbert would have accepted this rendering of his research is open to debate.

Now, Lautman does not describe in any real detail the historical Plato. His Platonism serves to defend his own particular conception of current mathematical research. He can of course claim that "We do not understand by Ideas the models whose mathematical entities would merely be copies, but in the true Platonic sense of the term, the structural schemes according to which the effective theories are organized" (p. 199). His interpretation of dialectics leads us to the dynamics of theory construction as revealed in the history of mathematics. Lautman then can be seen as seizing on Platonism in order to further his own project. Ideas or Forms are called on in order to make sense of the rationality and objectivity of the world; they also explain the underlying unity of mathematics as well as the efficiency of mathematical language for physics. There are, to be sure, important connections in Plato's work between metaphysics and geometry as well as other mathematical sciences such as astronomy. But the interpretation under examination faces difficulties. It is based on an elaborate reconstruction of Plato's oral teachings; it overlooks obvious differences between Plato's science and modern science. We may question to what extent Lautman himself avoids slipping into idealism -- an idealized realism or a realism of idealities. Furthermore, one may wonder what place is left for metaphysics in this conception, supposedly opposed to positivism, but claiming to be carried out from an internal point of view.

Lautman's work is indeed demanding and difficult. He calls on a large variety of mathematical theories. He admits to no elementary or fundamental branch of mathematics; there is no hierarchy. In his view, ideas circulate from one area to another. As Fernando Zalamea, author of the introductory article provided in this volume, has it: "Flexible frontiers arise in a new classification, which, rather than a Porphyrian tree, seems more like a liquid surface in which the information flows between mobile nuclei of knowledge" (p. xxviii). There are no shortcuts or simplifications. It is a difficult method to imitate, one which requires an encyclopedic knowledge. What proved an easier route to follow was to start with first‑order predicate logic and then gradually modify it to include more and more complex theories. This was the route taken by mainstream philosophy. Such a logic provides an accessible and simple language for philosophers. Its limitations should however be made clear.

Despite the shortcomings of Lautman's mathematical philosophy as they become apparent some three quarters of a century after his doctoral dissertation, this volume will enable the English-speaking reader to become acquainted with a thinker who formulated a strong alternative to mainstream conceptions of mathematics. Lautman, along with Cavaillès and Herbrand, elaborated a research program which helped to shape French thought, influencing figures as diverse as Gilles Deleuze, Gilles‑Gaston Granger or Alain Badiou. Logical positivism having lost its hegemony, Lautman's work takes on a new significance: he rejected this doctrine long before Kuhn, or, to evoke authors more directly involved in logic and mathematics, he anticipated Quine, Lakatos and Putnam. His efforts to understand the realities with which mathematics is concerned as well as the interactions between the various branches of mathematics can provide fruitful insight to those seeking to explore other possibilities.

The demise of axiomatics as the sole option for philosophical analysis and the recognition of diverse styles of reasoning and interest in the dynamics of theory development should induce us to reconsider the history of philosophy of science, taking into account those theories that have been neglected. Reading Lautman can help us enrich our picture of the development of the field and take into consideration an option quite different from the received view.