Mathematics in Kant's Critical Philosophy

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Shabel, Lisa, Mathematics in Kant's Critical Philosophy, Routledge, 2003, 192pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415939550.

Reviewed by Houston Smit, University of Arizona


Lisa Shabel’s Mathematics in Kant’s Critical Philosophy appears in the Routledge Series of Outstanding Dissertations. It was accepted by the University of Pennsylvania in the Fall of 1997 as her doctoral dissertation, and appears in its original form, without updates or revisions. Part of the material in the book appeared in Shabel’s award-winning 1998 article, “Kant on the Symbolic Construction of Mathematical Concepts”(Studies in the History and the Philosophy of Science). But there is much else of considerable interest in this outstanding book.

Shabel’s title is, in one respect, somewhat misleading. For her book is devoted as much to Euclid’s Elements and to the history and philosophy of early modern mathematics as it is to the critical Kant’s treatment of mathematics. The title is, nonetheless, appropriate. For Shabel discusses Kant’s predecessors in the service of providing background she argues is crucial to understanding the account of mathematics that figures in the Critique of Pure Reason. Moreover, Shabel’s overarching aim is to clarify the conception of synthetic a priori cognition central to the critical philosophy, and to do so by shedding light on Kant’s account of the construction of mathematical concepts. Shabel’s strategy turns on carefully examining the role that the production of diagrams plays in the mathematics of the early moderns, both in their practice and in their own understanding of their practice. For, she argues, attending to this background – one with which Kant was, through the mathematical textbooks of Christian Wolff, intimately acquainted – guards against anachronisms that have lead even the best of Kant’s commentators to ascribe to him a philosophy of mathematics that is obviously inadequate and implausible. Indeed, Shabel contends, attending to this background allows us to see that Kant’s account of mathematics is in fact an insightful account of the mathematics that early moderns were engaged in.

Shabel largely succeeds in her aims, and does so admirably. She demonstrates that her interpretive strategy – namely, that of examining Kant’s philosophy of mathematics in light of the actual practice of early modern mathematics – is a fruitful and important one. Her pursuit of this strategy yields readings of many central tenets of Kant’s philosophy of mathematics that are invariably rich and provocative – even if some of these readings are not, in the end, entirely convincing. The book is an important contribution to scholarship on Kant’s philosophy of mathematics; it will be of interest to anyone working on Kant’s theoretical philosophy. What is more, Shabel’s book contains valuable treatments of Euclid, Descartes, and Wolff, as well as of Kant. I highly recommend this book, not only to Kant scholars, but also to anyone interested in the history and philosophy of early modern mathematics.

The first of the book’s three chapters is devoted to a detailed examination of Euclid’s Elements, one that focuses on explaining how diagrams play an integral role in Euclid’s reasoning. Shabel argues that Euclid’s project is to provide definitions and common notions that allow a geometer to demonstrate propositions through the construction of diagrams. Euclid thus does not regard diagrams as merely heuristic supplements to demonstrations that are given independently of these diagrams. Rather, he takes the construction of diagrams to be what makes the reasoning that yields geometric demonstrations possible, by warranting this reasoning. In particular, constructed diagrams directly warrant inferences about spatial relations by exhibiting these spatial relations. Euclid, then, was not out to provide a formal axiomatization of geometry – a set of first principles from which all geometric propositions can be derived deductively. And he did not rest the establishing of mathematical objects on the consistency of such an axiom system. Rather, Euclid took the construction and interpretation of diagrams, guided by the definitions and common notions he supplies, to be what originally grounds the methods of geometry and establishes the existence of its objects.

Shabel’s treatment of Euclid’s Elements is carefully crafted, and a pleasure to read. She presents the material elegantly, along with a wealth of acute and perceptive commentary on interpretative details that support her contention that the construction of diagrams is integral to Euclid’s geometry. Shabel also defends Euclid’s method from some standard objections by appealing to her interpretation of the character and role of the construction of diagrams in this method. Shabel’s treatment of the Elements is, moreover, indispensable to her overall project, because it provides the basis for the story of early modern mathematics she goes on to tell. Early modern treatments of geometry took the form of re-interpretations of Euclid’s Elements, and Shabel attends to the details of these re-interpretations to shed light on the conception of geometry that early moderns took to their study of Euclid. Moreover, according to Shabel, early modern revolutions in mathematics can be understood properly only when viewed in light of the way early modern mathematicians assimilated Euclidian geometry. Specifically, changes in the conception of number over the 17th and 18th centuries, as well as the development and application of algebraic and analytic methods by Viete, Descartes, and others, lead to changes in the way in which the disciplines of geometry and arithmetic were understood. But they did not lead either to the rejection of Euclid’s basic conception of geometry or to the severing of algebra or arithmetic from geometry. Rather, Shabel contends, early moderns all made plane Euclidian geometry – understood, with Euclid, as integrally dependent on the construction of diagrams – foundational to all of mathematics, including arithmetic and algebra.

The second chapter consists of a discussion of early modern mathematics that ranges over the work of Viete, Descartes, Williamson, Barrow, Lamy, and several others. Shabel structures the chapter around the overarching task of clarifying aspects of Wolff’s Elementa Matheseos Universae with most direct bearing on Kant’s account of mathematical construction. After briefly introducing Wolff’s mathematics texts and surveying the reception of Euclid’s Elements in the early modern period, Shabel takes on two ambitious projects. The first is to clarify how geometry and arithmetic are related, both in early modern mathematical practice and in the early modern understanding of that practice. Shabel argues that early moderns, including Wolff, retained understandings of number, the object of arithmetic, that rely on traditionally geometric conceptions of line length and commensurability. They did so on the grounds that only the construction of line segments of uniform length represents magnitudes with the clarity and distinctness requisite to establish the objects of mathematics. The second project is to clarify how Wolff and his contemporaries conceived of algebra and analysis in relation to the sciences of arithmetic and geometry. According to Shabel, algebra does not, for these figures, serve to demarcate its own objects, but rather provides methods for reasoning about the objects of arithmetic and geometry. Algebraic equations symbolize geometric constructions and provide new resources for solving traditional geometric and arithmetic problems. These points are reflected in the fact that, in early modern mathematics texts, the algebraic construction of equations consists in the geometric construction of lines and figures. Shabel closes the chapter by examining in detail Wolff’s treatment of the Hypotenuse Problem, one that illustrates how he conceived of constructed line segments as what constitute solutions to traditional geometric problems. Her culminating thesis is that Wolff, echoing a consensus among the early moderns, conceives of arithmetic and algebra as dependent on the more fundamental discipline of geometry, on the grounds that geometric constructions are what define any species of magnitude, the object of mathematics.

Shabel makes a convincing case that, following Euclid, early modern mathematicians – both in practice and in the understanding of this practice – accorded the construction of diagrams a fundamental and indispensable role in geometry. This is itself an important, and controversial, result. Moreover, in attending to the way in which early moderns assimilated Euclid, Shabel brings out helpfully how they took the mental act of geometric construction itself, as against the diagram that this act produces, as what makes the nature of mathematical objects transparent to the subject. More generally, they held that an act of mathematical construction makes manifest the rule it follows in constructing its object; and since this rule is definitive of the constructed object, the act of construction thereby makes manifest the definition, and thereby the real possibility, of that object. Less convincing is her case for the claim that all the early moderns, including Wolff, conceived of arithmetic and algebra as dependent on the more fundamental discipline of geometry. Indeed, as Daniel Sutherland has recently argued, Stevin, Wallis, Euler, and Wolff arguably all subscribe – consistently or no – to the view that arithmetic operations can ground notions of number independently of geometric constructions. In any case, Shabel’s sophisticated discussion bears careful study, for it makes important contributions to our understanding of the evolving relation between geometry, arithmetic, and algebra in the early modern period.

The third chapter builds on the second chapter’s treatment of early modern mathematics to provide a new interpretation of Kant’s account of mathematics as a body of synthetic a priori cognition produced through the construction of mathematical concepts. Now the construction of a mathematical concept consists, on Kant’s account, in the exhibition of a pure intuition corresponding to that concept. Shabel’s first move is to draw on her treatment of early modern mathematical practice to clarify this difficult notion of pure intuition. She proposes that, on Kant’s account, one and the same sensible object – say, a diagram – can constitute either a pure or an empirical intuition. It constitutes a pure intuition insofar as, in being aware of that object, one attends to one’s own act of constructing that diagram in the manner that, Shabel has argued, was commonly practiced in early modern geometry. But it constitutes an empirical intuition, insofar as one inspects it merely as an empirically presented object, and so apart from the procedure for its construction. Mathematical cognition derives the necessity and universality characteristic of a priori cognition through the awareness of one’s procedure in constructing objects and thus through the exhibition of objects in pure intuition. One particularly promising way in which Shabel develops and defends her reading is by appeal to Kant’s account of schemata of pure sensible concepts: she argues that these schemata are the rules that govern and characterize acts of mathematical construction. Shabel next shifts her attention to Kant’s account of algebraic cognition, focusing on his conception of the symbolic or characteristic construction by which algebra proceeds. According to Shabel, the prevailing view of Kant’s account of symbolic construction takes this construction to be one out of algebraic symbols, just as geometric or ostensive construction is the construction of a mathematical object (say a triangle) out of other mathematical objects (lines). Constructed algebraic formulae exhibit in intuition concepts of variable numeric quantity in the same way that constructed geometric figures exhibit concepts of those figures. On this view, moreover, the rules of symbolic construction are to be understood on analogy with numerical rules of calculation, and symbolic constructions themselves exhibit mathematical objects in intuition to establish genuine synthetic a priori cognition of mere magnitude. Shabel rejects all aspects of the prevailing view. She argues that symbolic constructions do not exhibit objects in intuition, and thus are not themselves constructions of our concepts of abstract algebraic relations; rather, they merely symbolize ostensive constructions of these concepts. Thus, for Kant, algebra is not solely, or even primarily, concerned with arithmetic relations. Rather, in keeping with the early modern consensus examined in Chapter 2, Kant regarded algebraic symbolism as nothing but a useful short-hand for the manipulations of geometrically constructible objects. He held that the generation and manipulation of algebraic symbols in symbolic construction cannot itself serve, as does ostensive construction, to establish any genuine mathematical cognition.

There is much in Chapter 3 that warrants close critical discussion, but here I can only raise a concern about its reading of symbolic construction. Shabel makes a strong case that Kant should not, and does not, conceive of symbolic construction as exhibiting mathematical objects in intuition, in the way that ostensive construction exhibits lines and figures. In particular, he should not, and does not, conceive of inscribed algebraic formulae as constructed objects of mathematics, in the way that lines and figures are. Symbolic construction is not a construction in intuition of objects that correspond to algebraic concepts, as ostensive construction is of objects that correspond to geometric concepts. But it seems overly hasty to conclude from this, as Shabel does, that symbolic constructions cannot themselves exhibit algebraic concepts in intuition, and can do nothing more than symbolize the only constructions that do – namely, ostensive constructions. Indeed, Kant’s description of symbolic construction as construction “in which one exhibits in intuition by signs the concepts, especially of relations of quantities” (A734/B762) certainly suggests that he conceives of symbolic construction as itself exhibiting our concepts of the relations of mere magnitude in intuition.

But how can symbolic construction exhibit algebraic concepts in intuition, if not by constructing in intuition objects corresponding to these concepts? We can find a first, and schematic, approximation of Kant’s answer in the following passage:

[Algebra] chooses a certain notation for all construction of magnitudes in general (numbers), as well as addition, subtraction, extraction of roots, etc., and, after it has also designated the general concept of quantities in accordance with their different relations, it then exhibits in intuition all procedures through which magnitude is generated and altered in accordance with certain general rules; where one magnitude is to be divided by another, it places their symbols together in accordance with the form of notation for division, and thereby achieves by a symbolic construction equally well what geometry does by an ostensive or geometrical construction (of the objects themselves), which discursive cognition could never achieve by mere concepts. (A717/B745)

What the algebraist exhibits in intuition are not the objects that correspond to algebraic concepts – magnitudes in general, determinations of a thing through which it can be measured or counted (A242/B300) – but rather certain procedures. These procedures are ones for generating and altering magnitudes in general in a way that exhibit in time, the form of our inner sense, our concepts of their relations. Kant’s thought seems to be that the algebraist employs these procedures, in his manipulation of algebraic formulae and so through his imagination, to generate and alter magnitudes as they are represented in these formulae. And in doing so, the algebraist applies algebraic concepts to the manifold given in the form of our inner sense (one that exhibits the character of temporal succession in intuition) so as to be directly conscious of how this application determines the general rules that specify and govern these procedures. In this way, the algebraist generates synthetic a priori cognition of relations of magnitude, insofar as magnitudes in general can be given to us in our sensibility and thus to our cognition. And he does so in a way analogous to that in which – as Shabel herself insightfully explicates – the geometer is conscious, in ostensive construction, of the rules that specify the procedures he employs in that construction. That symbolic construction can itself establish genuine synthetic a priori cognition just as well as ostensive construction can is, I take it, what Kant is saying in this passage when he likens what the symbolic construction of a relation of division achieves to what ostensive construction achieves. According to Shabel, what Kant here says symbolic construction does “equally well” as ostensive construction is merely to determine the quotient, not to exhibit the concept of the division in intuition so as to establish synthetic a priori cognition (p. 127). But this reading seems strained – especially in light of the final clause of the passage, which implies that symbolic construction, like ostensive construction, itself achieves something that requires intuitive representation.