Mathematics, Models, and Modality: Selected Philosophical Essays

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John P. Burgess, Mathematics, Models, and Modality: Selected Philosophical Essays, Cambridge UP, 2008, 301pp., $94.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521880343.

Reviewed by Thomas Hofweber, University of North Carolina at Chapel Hill



Mathematics, Models, and Modality is contains a selection of John Burgess’ philosophical papers. The book consists of 12 previously published essays, plus two new ones, an introduction, and an annotated bibliography of a number of Burgess’ technical papers on set theory and logic. The essays are divided into two parts. The first, entitled Mathematics, deals with Burgess’ critique of nominalism, his views on meta-ontology, and the foundations and philosophy of mathematics. The second part, entitled Models, Modality, and More, consists of essays on various other topics including de re modality, Fitch’s paradox, the semantics of proper names, and the philosophy of logic. These essays cover a large range of topics. Some are highly influential papers in the field. It is an impressive collection of work.

I. Summary of the book

The collection starts with “Numbers and ideas”, a paper based on a talk for a general audience arguing against the position sometimes held by mathematicians and others that numbers exist ‘in the world of ideas’. This essay provides an introduction to the topic of the ontology of mathematics.

The next four essays are the ones that are most closely connected in the collection and they form the heart of the book. They are the most influential, they are essentially on the same topic, and they nicely show the development of Burgess’ view on the subject of nominalism and ontology. The first of them, “Why I am not a nominalist”, originally appeared in 1983, the other three, "Mathematics and Bleak House", “Quine, mathematics, and analyticity”, and “Being explained away”, are from 2004 or 2005. These essays contain Burgess’s critique of contemporary nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics and his views about ontology. I will critically discuss them in more detail below.

The first part of the book concludes with a paper on the foundations of set theory entitled "E pluribus unum: plural logic and set theory" and a paper on logicism in the philosophy of mathematics entitled “Logicism: a new look”. In "E pluribus unum" Burgess proposes to combine two ideas to give a new foundation for set theory. One idea, due to George Boolos, is the use of plural quantification instead of second order quantification or quantification over proper classes. The other, due to Paul Bernays and developed by Harvey Friedman, is to use reflection principles in the axiomatization of set theory. Burgess proposes a new axiomatization of set theory called BB (for Bernays-Boolos) based on these two ideas and discusses its relation to the standard axiomatization of set theory.

In “Logicism: a new look” Burgess outlines, but doesn’t defend, a version of logicism that combines ideas from Hilbert’s program with contemporary versions of Frege’s form of logicism. This paper is connected to a detailed study of contemporary versions of Frege’s logicism that Burgess carried out earlier in (Burgess 2005). It is one of the two new papers in this collection.

The second part of the collection of essays ranges more widely than the first. It starts with “Tarski’s tort”, which argues that we should not confuse model theory with semantics and points to a number of examples where such a confusion seems to be made and the negative consequences that come from it. It is the second, and beside the paper on logicism, only other new paper in the collection.

“Which modal logic is the right one?” is the next, aptly titled, paper. Burgess considers different notions of necessity and asks which modal logic correctly captures necessity in these senses. He proposes an answer for one case, and discusses some options for another case.

“Can truth out?” is a paper on Fitch’s paradox, in particular on temporal aspects of Fitch’s paradox. It was originally published in a volume devoted to Fitch’s Paradox. It also deals with de re knowledge, tying it to the next two papers.

"Quinus ab omni naevo vindicatus" discusses Quine’s objections to de re modality and early replies that were made against Quine. Burgess argues that given the conceptions of de re modality Quine was arguing against at the time, Quine was right.

In “Translating names” Burgess criticizes Millian theories of names and hopes to defend a position intermediate between Millian theories and descriptive theories.

The last two papers in the collection defend classical logic against two kinds of attacks. First, “Relevance: a fallacy?” argues that an inference form that relevance logicians reject, but classical logicians accept, is in fact employed in ordinary reasoning. Second, “Dummett’s case for intuitionism” argues against Dummett’s attempt to establish intuitionism as the logic we should abide by.

II. Critical discussion

The nominalism papers in the first part of the book, “Why I am not a nominalist”, "Mathematics and Bleak House", “Quine, mathematics, and analyticity”, and “Being explained away”, provide the clearest case in the collection of a group of papers that deal with one unified set of issues. The papers closely relate to each other, and one often illuminates another one. I will focus my critical discussion on them. In particular, I will first discuss Burgess’ criticism of nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics, and second his views on meta-ontology.

a) Burgess’ critique of nominalism

Burgess’ critique of contemporary forms of nominalism in the philosophy of mathematics appears in its first version in his 1983 paper “Why I am not a nominalist”. Nominalists in general hold that all there is is concrete, just the world in space and time. Nominalists in the philosophy of mathematics in particular hold that there are no such things as mathematical objects. Burgess focused his critique on the nominalistic philosophies of Hartry Field and Charles Chihara. Field proposed an answer to the indispensability argument for mathematical objects. This argument, in essence, says that since we can’t do science without quantifying over mathematical objects we have to believe in mathematical objects. Field, in (Field 1980), showed how one can do some science without quantifying over mathematical objects, which he took to be a point in favor of nominalism. Chihara, in (Chihara 1973), proposed a semantics for mathematical language that doesn’t involve abstract mathematical objects. Instead of numbers mathematical language is taken to talk about possible numerals. He, too, took this to be a point in favor of nominalism. Burgess’ objection against proposals like these was that either they are taken as proposals about how mathematical or scientific language in fact is, or as proposals how such a language should be. The former he labeled the “hermeneutic” the latter the “revolutionary” nominalist proposal. Either way, Burgess argued, these proposals are doomed to fail. The hermeneutic proposal is not only unsupported by any linguistic evidence, it is also irrelevant (p.4). Whatever the semantics of “There are infinitely many prime numbers” is, it will imply “There are numbers”. And whether that is true is the whole issue under discussion, or so Burgess claims (p.90). The revolutionary proposals are to be assessed as proposals of alternative versions of current scientific theories. As new science they have failed to draw in the scientific community. They are simply an inferior theory, by scientific standards, and thus don’t help the nominalist. The best theory still quantifies over numbers, and thus we should believe in mathematical objects.

Burgess’ argument against philosophers that hope to draw conclusions in favor of nominalism thus comes in two parts. One against the hermeneutic versions of the nominalist proposal, and one against the revolutionary version. I take the second argument to be more controversial, but I think Burgess is correct here. However, I don’t think he is correct in his argument against the hermeneutic proposals.

What if we can do science, even mathematics, just as well as we do without having the implication from our best theories that numbers exist? Some would hold that this should undermine our confidence in our present theories, and the indispensability argument is one strong way to articulate this idea. If you have to do it a particular way then you really have to believe in it. If you could have done it another way just as well, or almost as well, then you don’t have to believe in it. However, I think Burgess is right in his rejection of this. We should believe in our best theories as they are, even if we realize that we could have done things completely differently. Approaches that show that we could have done science or mathematics differently shouldn’t undermine our belief in science and mathematics as it is, or at least they shouldn’t undermine it by much.

The other horn of Burgess’ dilemma is, however, much more involved than he makes it out to be. Hermeneutic approaches, he holds, have no evidence in their favor, nor are they relevant. The former is certainly true for proposals like Chihara’s. No one should take this seriously as a proposal about the actual semantics of mathematical language. The later, however, is not true. Considerations about the semantics of mathematical language are highly relevant for the question of nominalism. Burgess argued that they are irrelevant since no matter what the semantics of mathematical language, the mathematical theorem “There are infinitely many prime numbers” will always imply “There are numbers” and thus imply something that refutes nominalism. But semantic considerations are relevant for figuring out whether or not the sentences “There are numbers” and “There are infinitely many primes” have one or more readings, whether there are one or more things that can be said with an utterance of this sentence. To illustrate this issue, let’s take “Numbers exist”. How many readings does this sentence have? This is not at all clear. In English “exists” is a verb, and verbs in English are notoriously polysemous. “My laptop crashed” has a reading where my laptop’s software hung up. But laptops can also crash like cars can, just put some wheels on them and race them. On the other hand, they can’t crash like drug users can, coming down from a high. One can run a seminar or a marathon, on different readings of “run”. And so on and so forth. What about “exists”? What about “There are numbers”? Do they have one reading, or many? This is an empirical question about our language, and it is one that is relevant for the question of nominalism. If “there are numbers” and “numbers exist” has more than one reading, then it might well be that mathematics implies it on one reading and nominalism is debating it on another reading. The investigation of language, in particular mathematical language, is most relevant for this, and thus for finding out about nominalism. In this case it isn’t true that there is no evidence that would suggest that “numbers exist” has more than one reading. That verbs in general are polysemous is a widely held view among linguists, and “exists” is a verb. Even when used in pure mathematics, as in a statement of Euclid’s Theorem, we use language that is pronounced just like parts of our ordinary natural language. It is a substantial empirical question whether or not “exists” is polysemous, and whether “Numbers exist” and “There are numbers” have many readings or just one. This applies to ordinary English as well as mathematical language, if it is taken to be different from ordinary English. These are hard and relevant questions, they are closely tied to the semantics of mathematical language and Burgess is thus wrong when he holds that these considerations are not relevant.

In “Why I am not a nominalist” Burgess focused on mathematical language when he criticized “hermeneutic” approaches to nominalism, which did not directly address fictionalist approaches. Fictionalists might well agree with platonists on the semantics of mathematical language, but disagree with them about what the attitude is that mathematicians do, or should, have towards the contents expressed by such sentences. In "Mathematics and Bleak House" in particular, the fictionalist option for nominalism is discussed in detail. Burgess points out, correctly, that there are many disanalogies between fiction and mathematics. And he again, correctly I think, dismisses a revolutionary approach towards the attitude that speakers of the mathematical language should have to the contents that they express with the sentences they utter. Mathematics is fine as it is, but what attitude do speakers in fact have when they utter these sentences? Here Burgess again underestimates the complexities of the empirical issues involved. Burgess takes hermeneutic fictionalism to be the position "that the mathematicians’ own understanding of their talk of mathematical entities is that of a form of fiction" (p.52, emphasis in original).

But this is not the right position to argue against. What matters is whether mathematicians in fact have certain attitudes, not whether they realize that they have them. Self-reporting is not the best guide to psychological reality, and there are many cases where it is an open empirical question whether we have attitudes of a special kind without being aware of them in normal circumstances. Take a simple example. (This is a true story.) As I was writing this review my computer started to act funny. Sometimes the screen would fill with weird color patterns, sometimes it would crash unexpectedly, completely freezing up. I now seem to have fixed the problem by uninstalling a piece of software. (End of story.) Now, when I describe my situation in this way, am I speaking literally? Am I engaging in a special attitude towards the contents that the sentences I utter express that is something other straightforward literal assertion? I think this is a hard question. When I say that my computer acts funny, do I attribute agency to it? There are several options: a) I do, in the same sense in which I attribute agency to my office neighbor, (and presumably I thus speak falsely), b) the word “act” is polysemous, one reading is agency that applies to people and other agents, the other applies to all kinds of less sophisticated things, c) I engage in some special attitude towards my computer, whether or not I know it, and this attitude engenders an attitude towards the contents of my assertions about my computer. Which one is it? This is a hard question. My self-reporting on the matter might be one piece of evidence, but it in no way is conclusive. There is evidence beyond self-reporting that is relevant and probably more illuminating. For example, researchers working on human-computer interaction found out early on, to their surprise, that ordinary people working with computers naturally attribute propositional attitudes and other psychological characteristics to them. Maybe such assertions are thus to be understood non-literally? That in part depends on how ascriptions of propositional attitudes are to be understood when they made of people. If there is a crucial difference, then maybe this is evidence for a special attitude we have towards computers and assertions about their actions. But on the other hand, we also attribute agency to our toasters. Maybe that is evidence for polysemy? When I say my computer acted funny, did I mean what I said? I would say yes. But do computers really act, are they really agents? Here I would caution. This might not be too different from asking mathematicians if they meant it when they said that a solution exists. Sure. But do solutions really exist? We all have seen the caution that follows, and the question is what explains it.

None of this is any evidence for nominalism, to be clear. But I think Burgess underestimates the complexities of the empirical questions involved. Both questions about mathematical language and psychological questions in relation to mathematical activity are difficult and hard questions. And they are most relevant for the debate about nominalism. If it turns out that the sentences “There are numbers” or “Numbers exist” have multiple readings, then it might well turn out that the question we ask in ontology, i.e. “Do numbers exist?”, is based on one reading, and the results of mathematics, which imply “Numbers exist”, use another reading. And similarly for questions about psychology and our attitudes in our mathematical and philosophical activity.

Burgess is, I think, correct in making clear that certain nominalistic proposals are in effect empirical conjectures. But he is mistaken in holding that they fairly trivially turn out to be false. The empirical is a mess, and language and the mind are great examples of that. This applies to both sides of the debate. If there is a coherent nominalistic option which is in effect an empirical hypothesis, then the hypothesis that this option is false is also an empirical hypothesis. The view that “Numbers exist” has more than one reading is an empirical hypothesis about language, but so is the view that it only has one reading. It won’t be easy to find out who is right.

The central role of the empirical questions here is somewhat masked by the terminology that Burgess introduced for the view that as a matter of fact our mathematical language or activity supports nominalism. Burgess called this option of a nominalist program hermeneutic nominalism, in contrast with revolutionary nominalism, and this terminology is now widely accepted. But such a nominalist proposal in general has nothing to do with hermeneutics in the sense of, for example, Gadamer, in (Gadamer 1989). In that sense hermeneutics is a part of the humanities, and not an empirical science. What the meaning of a text is is not something that can simply be determined by empirical investigation, but a joint product of the investigator and the author. Nothing like this applies to the empirical questions about language and mind. They are simple questions about empirical facts, not facts in part determined by the interpreter. In general, any view should try to avoid having its labels determined by those who don’t hold the view, and “hermeneutic nominalism” is no exception.

b) Burgess on meta-ontology

On a simple reading of Burgess’ critique of nominalism one might get the impression that he holds that there is no philosophical work to be done on the ontology of mathematical objects. Mathematics establishes that there are numbers, and that was the whole question. This is partly right. But Burgess, in particular in “Being explained away”, offers an intriguing view in what is often called meta-ontology. Burgess proposes that the failure to recognize the truth of this view is in the end the source of the persistence of the debate about nominalism. (p.103). I will conclude by discussing Burgess’ view on this matter.

Burgess holds that nominalists are in the grip of a pre-Kantian picture of ontology. They, at least the more reasonable kind, hold that besides our acceptance of mathematics we can still ask the question whether numbers are part of ultimate metaphysical reality. Ultimate metaphysical reality is reality as it is in itself, “or equivalently a description of the universe as God sees it” (p.93). All we can do is describe the world with the conceptual scheme we happen to have, and it makes clear that there are numbers. Other schemes might have done it differently. But what is the world like independently of our scheme? What is it like in itself? To try to find this out is to engage, according to Burgess, in pre-Kantian metaphysics. Once we give this up we will see that the temptation of nominalism is a false one. Our conceptual scheme clearly makes us accept that there are numbers. Any further questions are pointless. Burgess likens this position to Carnap’s and he identifies himself as a neo-Carnapian about ontology (p.6).

Burgess’ view is in between two views which are not uncommon: first there is the view that holds that the distinction between what reality is like and what ultimate metaphysical reality is like is an illusory one. Some of the things we say about reality are true, and so reality is like that. There is no ultimate metaphysical reality beyond that. Second, there is the view that there is a legitimate distinction between what reality is like and what ultimate metaphysical reality is like. Metaphysics is the grand project to find out about the latter. Burgess’ view is in between. He accepts that there is a reasonably clear enough distinction between what reality is like and what ultimate metaphysical reality is like, but he argues that it is “pointless” (p.103) or not a feasible aim (p.95) to try to find out about the latter. Thus for Burgess a) there is a way God thinks to himself about the word, which describes it as it is in itself, but b) for us to try to find out what that is is beyond what we can hope to do.

I found both of these aspects of Burgess’ view problematic. I did not see what the distinction between reality and ultimate metaphysical reality was supposed to be, and why, if we accept it, it is hopeless for us to find out what the latter is like. On the first, when we describe the world truly with our language, in what sense does this give us only a true description of the world as it is for us, and not as it is in itself? Burgess doesn’t say much about how this is to be understood, but he does give an argument that even thinking of the world as containing any objects at all is, in a sense, optional. We can well enough understand other conceptual schemes that skip objects, and thus we should not conclude from our correctly describing the world as containing objects that the world contains objects as it is in itself: "There is nothing wrong with our speaking as we do, but there is nothing uniquely right about it either" (p.97). The argument is based on Quine’s predicate functor version of first order logic. Instead of doing first order logic with variables and quantifiers we could have done it with predicate functors, and we can see that we can do this ‘equivalently’, in some sense. We can replace variables, quantifiers, and the Boolean connectives with operators that form predicates from predicates. In the end we have the variables explained away, and this way we have objects, or being, explained away. Others might have used such predicate functors, Burgess argues, and done as well as we did without ever talking about objects. We thus shouldn’t conclude from what we are doing right in our conceptual scheme that reality as it is in itself, ultimate metaphysical reality, contains any objects.

I found this argument unconvincing. Why should we think of a predicate functor version of first order logic as anything other than a different syntactic version of first order predicate languages from the more common one? Why think that the predicate functor syntax does not involve talk of any objects? The idea is that ‘to be is to be the value of a variable’ and predicate functor logic doesn’t have any variables in the usual sense. But this is a mistake. One can surely argue that ontological commitment is carried by the variables in a language that has variables. But that shouldn’t be taken to mean that in a language that doesn’t have any variables that there is no ontological commitment, or that we do not talk about objects in it, or any of that. The particular syntactic features of the language do not determine what it is about. And so predicate functor versions of first order logic should not get us to think that talk of objects is just one of many equally correct ways of describing the world. In fact, it is not at all clear that this idea of Burgess’ can be made coherent. If my object-involving description of the world is, in good parts, true then how can it be that others are equally good, but don’t involve objects? Do they leave something out? Does their being equally good mean they are true as well? If they don’t leave something out and are also true, then how come they don’t say or imply that there are objects?

Suppose now that we can make sense of the distinction between how the world is in itself and how it is for us. Thus we can make sense between the distinction between reality and ultimate metaphysical reality, in Burgess’ terms. Why can’t we try to find out what the latter is like? Here I thought Burgess was surprisingly brief in his arguments, in particular since a number of contemporary metaphysicians are trying to do just that. The argument can’t just be that any representation by us would inevitably be infected by our conceptual scheme and thus not represent reality as it is in itself. Maybe our natural languages are so infected, but why not have another language? Or why not characterize ultimate metaphysical reality negatively: doesn’t contain colors, beauty, objects, etc. Burgess at several points suggests an epistemic consideration; for example, he suggests that Hume realized that trying to find out what ultimate metaphysical reality is like leads to skepticism (p. 93). His talk of it being hopeless or not feasible to do this can be understood epistemically, but I didn’t see the justification for this conclusion. It might at times be tempting to interpret Burgess as holding that we can’t do ontology in the traditional sense since we don’t have a grasp of what ultimate metaphysical reality is. But if we are allowed to talk about it in our meta-ontology, why not in our ontology?

III. Conclusion

Despite my disagreements with some of Burgess’ arguments I found this book to be a very rewarding collection of essays. Many of the papers are illuminated by others in the collection, and those who read Burgess’ papers on some topic will find it rewarding to read his papers on other topics. I did not critically discuss the papers I found more agreeable, since I could not resist the temptation to focus on those I disagree with. I hope many will consult this book. Unfortunately the book in its present formats is prohibitively expensive, at $94.00 for the hardback, or $79.00 for a .pdf download. I don’t know what compelled Cambridge University Press to make a book of mostly previously published, and often easily available, essays that costly. Despite my complimentary copy I don’t approve of the pricing, and I suspect Burgess doesn’t either. I can only hope that an inexpensive paperback version will be available soon.


Burgess, John (2005), Fixing Frege, Princeton UP.

Chihara, Charles (1973), Ontology and the Vicious Circle Principle, Cornell UP.

Field, Hartry (1980), Science without Numbers, Princeton UP.

Gadamer, Hans-Georg (1989), Truth and Method, 2nd rev. ed. (1st English ed., 1975), trans. by J. Weinsheimer and D.G. Marshall, Crossroad.