Mathematics of the Transcendental

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Alain Badiou, Mathematics of the Transcendental, A. J. Bartlett and Alex Ling (trs.), Bloomsbury, 2014, 282pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781441189240.

Reviewed by Colin McLarty, Case Western Reserve University


This book is a translation of notes that Badiou has not published in the original French. He circulated photocopies in his seminars in the 1990s as he began confronting category theory as a possible rival to the set theoretic mathematics he takes as ontology. When the Melbourne Badiou Reading Group began studying the notes in 2010, they began a translation, which Badiou allowed A. J. Bartlett and Alex Ling to complete and publish. As such the book is not an introduction to Badiou. It is a resource for going deeply into his other works that were written for publication.

A one sentence review suffices from that viewpoint: To study the background of Badiou's ontology since the 1980s, especially his idea of onto-logy and the transcendental, read these notes.

There is more to say about the relation to mathematics. The translators' preface quotes Badiou from 1982: "I hope that I say nothing imprecise in mathematics, but also nothing that is mathematically proffered" (p. 1). Much in the present notes, though, is mathematically proffered theorems, proofs, and exercises in category theory. Bellicose critics will be sorry to learn that these are correct.

However, Badiou looks at a limited and specifically logic-oriented part of the subject. When he says "the fundamental idea of categorical thought is that of defining possible universes" (p. 21), this is not mathematics. It is Badiou's choice of philosophic focus, at odds with both the origin and the current situation of category theory in mathematics. A more mathematical perspective will also argue against the surprisingly common view, which Badiou shares, that objects for category theory are "without any determinate interior" (p. 13). And, pace the title of the book, mathematics gives no reason for Badiou to restrict his transcendentals as he does.

Basic category theory is now standard in beginning graduate textbooks on algebra and various kinds of geometry. It is a very general way of dealing with structures by their relations to each other. The category of topological spaces describes those spaces by way of the continuous functions between them. This follows the long classical idea of describing a space by mapping it in other spaces. Badiou well describes what is fundamental to categories in actual use: "in a categorical universe an object is determined exclusively by the relations, or movements, of which this object is the source or target" (p. 13, his emphasis). This applies in all categories, not only the very rich ones he calls "possible universes." And it applies also to categories themselves.

The problem with calling universes the fundamental idea of category theory is not just that most interesting and useful categories lack the technical properties of Badiou's universes (not to be confused with Grothendieck universe, a set theoretic term used in some category theory). It is that even categories with those properties are rarely to be thought of as self-contained. Rigorous categorical foundations for mathematics depend on seeing how some categories, which Badiou can call possible universes, can be described in a self-contained way. This explicit insight is due to William Lawvere around 1960, and it can well be found implicit in the work of Alexander Grothendieck in the late 1950s as he developed the specific kind of category called a topos (see McLarty 2007; 2008). But it was unknown to Samuel Eilenberg and Saunders Mac Lane (named in this book, p. 13) when they created category theory, and it was never the fundamental idea for Grothendieck or Lawvere, let alone for graduate math textbooks.

The original motivation for categories, and later for toposes, and the key to nearly all use of either idea since then, is the thoroughgoing interrelation of categories by functors and interrelation of functors by natural transformations and adjunctions. Badiou could call functors the "movements" of categories, and in turn call natural transformations the movements of those movements (citing "movement" from p. 13, quoted more fully above). But functors come very little into this book. Natural transformations and adjunctions are not named. These multi-level articulated interrelations are vastly richer than the mere "plurality" of universes, which Badiou broaches late in the notes on "Topos'' (p. 140) (see Lurie 2009 for a recently influential mathematical argument for extending this articulation through infinitely many levels not only in principle, but in practice).

This book does have a pretty account of universal properties (pp. 27f.). Those are close kin to adjunctions, and they are involved in everything that comes after them in the book. Note that "universal property" is standard terminology in category theory, while Badiou poses philosophically motivated neologisms for many other terms.

Anyone interested in the relation of mathematics to philosophy should read Badiou's essay "Mathematics and philosophy" (Badiou 2006; cf. McLarty 2008). Badiou stays radically closer to classical philosophic texts than philosophers usually do. Notably, he is an avowed Platonist. Like Socrates in Plato's Republic, Badiou takes mathematics as the paradigm science of being while believing neither that mathematics itself answers philosophic questions nor that all existents are mathematical objects. He specifies the value of logic for a realist by saying "our maxim is: philosophy must enter into logic via mathematics, and not into mathematics via logic" (Badiou 2006, p. 24, his emphasis). But Badiou in these notes enters the mathematics of categories and toposes via logic.

The translators propose this approach for canonization. They refer twice to "the canonical text" (referring to Goldblatt 1979), plus listing it with Fourman and Scott (1979) and Higgs (1973) as "the canonical works" (pp. 9, 270n6, 270n7). These handle topos theory as logic. Both Fourman and Scott (1979) and Higgs (1973) are explicit about addressing specific logical issues, not topos theory as a whole and not even every aspect of topos logic.

If Badiou found those helpful sources for a beginner, I personally sympathize. I read them around the same time. But the standard references in the 1980s were quite a different thing, forbidding for opposite reasons. Grothendieck in Artin et al. (1972) was so relentlessly comprehensive, even the plethora of motivational remarks became overwhelming. Johnstone (1977) was so fiercely concise it was more a checklist of what to learn than a source. Yet they were and are indispensible. And how did the founding papers of Lawvere not get into this canon? All these works involve some logic. But they involve much more of mathematics than that, and they all rely heavily on relations and movements. To use the terms of art, they rely on functors, adjunctions, and other natural transformations.

The standard sources for topos theory now include the pellucid textbook MacLane and Moerdijk (1992) and the massive Johnstone (2002, 2003), and still Artin et al. (1972) and the papers of Lawvere. Philosophers might want to add Grothendieck (1985-1987). Badiou in 1988 wrote "those who want to participate in the development of ontology . . . must study the mathematicians of their time" (2007, p.13). Grothendieck is beyond all argument a huge figure in mathematics of our time. For extremely gentle accounts of fundamental categorical thinking see Lawvere (2003) and Lawvere and Rosebrugh (2003). Mathematical introductions include Awodey (2010) and Leinster (2014).

Algebraist Vera Serganova intended nothing controversial in her plenary talk at the 2014 International Congress of Mathematicians when she described category theory as "a way to study internal properties of objects in terms of their relations, their maps to other objects" (Serganova, minute 2). The mapping relations do not ignore internal properties, let alone deny them, but reveal them. That is why mathematicians use category theory.

Admittedly there is no consensus definition of internal. Badiou in these notes (pp. 13-14 and passim) says what he means. His account of the relevant mathematical differences between category theory and ZFC set theory is correct. Categorical foundations do not give objects "determinate interiors" in his sense, and ZFC does. But these interiors are external to mathematics, while Badiou wants to take mathematics as ontology.

For example, categorical foundations easily handle the natural numbers in terms of successor, addition, multiplication and the other arithmetic relations. Those are relations after all, or functions from the set of natural numbers to itself. What ZFC foundations further require, and categorical foundations do not, is that any specific set N taken to be the natural numbers must identify each number in a particular way. So for 2 it must have 2= or else 2={⏀,{⏀}}, or indeed 2 could be any ZFC set, so long as you pick one. If we take such equations as internal to the numbers, then we must say mathematicians virtually never use internal properties of numbers. If we also take mathematics as ontology, then internal properties will have little role in ontology.

I would rather say Dedekind's axioms (Dedekind 1888) give the interior determinations of the natural numbers, namely the arithmetic relations that number theory uses constantly. Category theory handles those directly. I could almost say I am siding with Serganova except that, again, she never meant her remark to take sides in any controversy.

Part Two of the notes starts with historical claims about the Greeks and Cantor, which would be fun to argue out if one had a lot of time to consult the sources. It is a mistake to suppose that when you do not see the grounds of some historical claim by Badiou, it must be groundless. Anyway he goes farther into those things elsewhere. The point here is "the transcendental."

Kant's transcendental is not transcendent. It is not beyond experience. It is in experience as the ground of possibility of experience. Badiou's transcendental is in a situation and "serves as a domain for the evaluation of identities and differences" in that situation (p. 167). Insofar as mathematical ontology takes a situation to be a categorical universe, a transcendental is what mathematicians call a poset of truth values, in the sense of global elements of a truth value object. In Part One Badiou calls truth value objects central objects. Mathematicians also use the term subobject classifier or sometimes Lawvere-Tierney object for the creators of the idea. This object is "central" to connecting movements inside a universe with its internal logic or in Badiou's terms linking ontology to logic.

What follow are many pages of theorems and proofs using these concepts -- but only for a very special case, which category theorists call the localic case. The theorems and proofs are standard. The terminology is not at all. Badiou's philosophically weighted innovations will be no obstacle to anyone studying him and the mathematical literature. The comparisons are not hard, and the philosophic point of each new term is clear. But do not expect topos theorists to understand that the transcendental of a situation is phenomenally complete. To talk with them, instead say the subobjects of 1 in a localic topos form a complete lattice. But really that holds in any Grothendieck topos, not only in localic ones.

This raises a puzzle. Why treat only the localic case? It is much narrower than the general case and not much simpler. Perhaps this is more an accident of Badiou's studies at the time he wrote the notes than a decision. The restriction has been sharply and knowledgeably criticized (Veilahti 2013). Quoting Badiou, Antti Veilahti makes this an occasion to "take even further the thinking of the logico-ontological, of the chiasmus between the mathematics of being and the logic of appearing" (Badiou 2009, p. 197, quoted in Veilahti 2013, p. 3).


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Alain Badiou. Théorie du sujet (1982) trans. by Bruno Bosteels as Theory of the Subject. Continuum, 2009.

Alain Badiou. L'Être et l'Événement (1988) trans. by Oliver Feltham as Being and Event. Bloomsbury Academic, 2007.

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