Matter Matters: Metaphysics and Methodology in the Early Modern Period

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Kurt Smith, Matter Matters: Metaphysics and Methodology in the Early Modern Period, Oxford University Press, 2010, 299pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199583652.

Reviewed by Edward Slowik, Winona State University


Kurt Smith's intriguing new book covers a host of topics in early modern philosophy that will be familiar to scholars of this period -- in particular, Descartes' method in the Meditations and other works -- but Smith's approach and arguments will strike many as refreshingly innovative and, it must be admitted, fairly controversial. In the Preface, Smith states that his book "is about the methods of analysis and synthesis, and how they underwrote what can be called the 'mathematization' of early modern physics" (p. vii), but the main emphasis is on Descartes, and to a lesser extent Leibniz, with two general themes interrelating the many separate issues covered in the work: first, to show how many modern mathematical concepts can be used to help elucidate Descartes' and Leibniz's analytic and synthetic methods, and second, to argue that Descartes' system relies on the existence of matter to render mathematics intelligible (and likewise for Leibniz).

Part I, however, largely treats ancient philosophy, with the intention being to uncover "in what ways Plato's method of analysis looks to be connected to Aristotle's theory of classification" (p. 11). Since later portions of the book consider both Plato's and Aristotle's various influences on Descartes' approach (in addition to other ancient sources), these three early chapters set the stage for these further discussions. In the four chapters that compose Part II, Descartes' method of analysis is investigated from the perspective of several modern logical or mathematical concepts and techniques (e.g., enumeration, partitions, equivalence relations, etc.), in an attempt to disclose the inner structure of Descartes' methodology. Part III, whose five chapters cover synthesis, chiefly investigates Leibniz within the framework of the concepts of combinatorics and group theory, although Descartes figures prominently in these discussions as well. Many of the main arguments put forward in the book are further developed and defended in the four chapters that constitute Part IV, alongside a critique of the work of several contemporary philosophers who have commented on Descartes' methodology (such as Nelson, Lennon, Nadler, Nolan, and Friedman, to name some of the more prominent ones).

For many contemporary analytic philosophers, the utilization of the mathematical-logical vocabulary that was forged in the late nineteenth and early twentieth centuries (by the positivists, among others) is a fairly common means of investigating metaphysical issues. Hence, Smith's attempt to employ these conceptual resources in assessing seventeenth-century philosophy can be viewed as justifiable, and it is often quite illuminating. (Indeed, I am clearly not averse to employing modern conceptual resources to investigate seventeenth-century theories of physics, and so am supportive of Smith's effort.) Nevertheless, there is at times a sneaking suspicion while reading Smith's book that a sort of mathematical sledgehammer is being used to crack a very puny methodological nut, such that the reward of utilizing all of these sophisticated resources is somewhat meager.

Take, for example, Smith's treatment of enumeration in Descartes, which he briefly defines as "a categorizational scheme or structure … that explicitly shows how the various classes of simple natures are related to one another" (p. 96). While Smith makes a good case that enumeration play an important role in the earlier Rules, he responds to the criticism that this procedure plays little role in Descartes' later work by invoking three alleged instances of enumeration in the Meditations: first, the method of doubt, which partitions all beliefs into sensory or non-sensory beliefs; second, the classification of ideas according to how much objective reality they contain; and third, the categorizing of the possible causal sources from which the idea of body is derived (pp. 110-112). Yet, even granting the adequacy of this enumeration-oriented analysis, isn't it true that all philosophers categorize and classify things (that often involve an infinite number of instances), and so isn't it fairly obvious that examples of enumeration will be located in the later Cartesian corpus as well? In fact, it might be much more difficult to locate a philosopher of any era, and not just the early modern period, who did not exploit something like an enumerative process at some juncture in her philosophical career!

This last point ties into a general criticism of the strategy involved in Smith's book. His Introduction provides a nice overview of one of his major goals for Parts II and III:

The equivalence relation (or common nature, as Descartes calls it) that serves to 'divide' (or sort) the objects of inquiry into the atomic categories (of the system) when performing analysis is nothing short of the binary operator we find at work in the synthetic system. Given that the latter system is a group, which is a mathematical system, and the system established by analysis is isomorphic to it, then the system established by analysis is a mathematical system. Thus, analysis and synthesis, understood as meeting the criteria of a group, are what conceptually account for the 'mathematization' of early modern physics. So, it is by way of these methods that seventeenth-century thinkers succeeded in producing a conceptual landscape that made possible a genuinely mathematical physics. (p. 11)

Yet, the transition from Smith's summary concerning analysis and synthesis to his conclusions about "physics" in the above passage appears a bit dubious. As mentioned above, much of the discussion of Descartes' methodology concerns his metaphysics, as does much in the sections on Leibniz, along with a number of other topics that should properly be considered within the scope of their work on logic or pure mathematics (e.g., determinants, logarithms, etc.). The important breakthroughs in Descartes' and Leibniz's physics per se, such as the development of laws of nature and conservation principles, collision rules and the calculus, etc., are simply not the main issues addressed in Smith's book. (Physics does come up at various points, although often tangentially and much less then one would have expected given the constant references to the importance of these conceptual developments for the rise of the new mathematical physics.) Consequently, it might be more accurate to conclude, given Smith's work, that aspects of Descartes' and Leibniz's approaches to analysis and synthesis can be interpreted as involving conceptual resources that are similar (and sometimes identical) to the mathematical structures used by physicists in later centuries -- but this admission is a far cry from claiming that these Rationalist analytic and synthetic methodologies "made possible a genuinely mathematical physics".

Smith's claim is very contentious, to put it bluntly, and thus requires a vast amount of evidence and argumentation to demonstrate that the use of these mathematical ideas in later physical theories can be directly traced back to Descartes' and Leibniz's analytic and synthetic methodologies (i.e., an awareness on the part of later physicists that these particular Rationalist methodologies do indeed contain mathematical ideas that can be put to a very different use in their physics). Unfortunately, Smith just does not provide much evidence to establish this claim, other than citing various historians and philosophers of mathematics who cite these philosophers (especially Leibniz) as having anticipated, or having had a rough understanding of, these later mathematical procedures (e.g., p. 141).

This is not to say that Descartes' and Leibniz's methodological work, as spelled out in Smith's exegesis, did not contribute to these later mathematical breakthroughs in physics; it is just that the case is not really laid out in Smith's book. On the other hand, since Smith provides a number of informative and entertaining discussions of the conceptual tools that these Rationalists employed and how they relate to later mathematical ideas, the overall value of Smith's work is certainly not diminished by his (possibly overreaching) claims about the influence of these Rationalist methodologies on the course of physics. In fact, many philosophers will likely find the wealth of historical data and side discussions that Smith offers (where he brings forth such luminaries as Wittgenstein, Carnap, and Russell, to name only a few) to be one of the central strengths and major contributions of the book. So, the above criticism must be put in its proper context.

On the other hand, there are a number of more crucial interpretive problems that involve the central thesis of Smith's book, namely, that matter is so essential for Descartes' and Leibniz's systems that "in a world where there is no matter, there are no mathematical truths" (p. 2). Smith also contends that the existence of matter "is sufficient for guaranteeing the intelligibility (or possibility) of mathematics", but, in what follows, we will focus on the stronger claim: "the existence of matter is taken to be necessary for the intelligibility of mathematics" (p. 3). One of the first questions that can be asked here is what Smith means by "intelligible". Although it is never quite defined, it likely means the "possibility" of mathematics, as in the parenthetical remark above.

Turning to the evidence for Smith's main thesis, there are two cases that figure prominently in his discussions. First, Descartes argues in the Principles that "for the continuous quantity ten feet, although this is unintelligible without some extended substance of which it is the quantity, it can be understood apart from this determinate substance" (CSM[1] I 226). In one of his comments on this passage, Smith asserts "that Descartes is committed to the inference that if there were no matter, mathematics (here mathematical entities like the magnitude ten feet and the number ten) would be unintelligible" (p. 280). Yet, as the juxtaposition of Descartes' and Smith's quotes clearly reveals, Smith's inference does not accord with Descartes' claim. It is the continuous quantity "ten feet" that cannot be understood apart from matter, not the mathematical entity "ten feet" (or "ten"). The reasoning behind Descartes' assertion that the quantity "ten feet" is not intelligible without a substance is due to the fact that he regards extension as the principle attribute of corporeal substance (CSM I 210), and that "nothingness cannot possess any extension" (CSM I 231; i.e., an attribute must be the attribute of a substance, a point that Smith himself acknowledges, p. 116).

Hence, there are two sorts of "extension" that need to be kept separate in examining these passages: first, extension considered as a bodily property, and which Descartes conceives in a Scholastic manner according to the traditional substance/accident scheme (however modified by his reliance on "modes" of substance); and, second, extension considered as a mathematical entity. In this second way of considering extension, Descartes also follows the Aristotelian/Scholastic tradition, since he rejects the view of mathematical entities as existing on their own separate from corporeal or incorporeal substance -- that is, Descartes rejects a Platonic, or Pythagorean, conception of mathematics and posits a nominalist conception instead. This stance is also clearly expressed in the Principles: "number, when it is considered simply in the abstract or in general, and not in any created thing, is merely a mode of thinking; and the same applies to all other universals, as we call them" (CSM I 212). Accordingly, one of the main criticisms that can be leveled at Smith's main thesis is that he seems to conflate these two distinct senses of mathematics and extension (with "extension" equated here, as in Smith's book, with three-dimensional geometry): namely, mathematics/extension "considered simply in the abstract" (as a universal) or "in any created thing" (as an attribute of substance). In short, a valuable topic that is never mentioned in the book, but which needs to be examined given Smith's overall interpretation, is the nominalist/Platonist divide in mathematics, since it is this debate that directly concerns the status of mathematical entities and truths.

Connected to these last comments, another issue that fails to receive the attention that it deserves in Smith's work is the status of the so-called "eternal truths", which include mathematical truths and are such that they "have been laid down by God and depend on him entirely no less than the rest of his creatures" and "are all inborn in our minds" (To Mersenne, 15 April 1630; CSMK III 23). It is with respect to this continuing correspondence with Mersenne that Smith wields his second piece of evidence for the necessity of matter for the intelligibility of mathematics. In a letter dated 27 May 1638, Descartes states:

You ask whether there would be space, as there is now, if God had created nothing. At first this question seems to be beyond the capacity of the human mind, like infinity, so that it would be unreasonable to discuss it; but in fact I think it is merely beyond the capacity of our imagination, like the question of the existence of God and the human soul. I believe that our intellect can reach the truth of the matter, which is, in my opinion, that not only would there not be any space, but even those truths which are called eternal -- as that 'the whole is greater than the part' -- would not be truths if God had not so established, as I think I wrote you once before. (CSMK III 102-103)

As regards this passage, Smith asserts that Descartes "seems to be suggesting that God's not creating space (that is, Cartesian matter) entails God's not creating other items such as mathematical truths" (pp. 279-280, see also p. 116). In furnishing this quote, however, Smith fails to attach the last few clauses, "if God had not so established, as I think I wrote you once before". This is important, for the earlier letters to Mersenne deal with eternal truths at great length (as hinted above in the letter from 15 April 1630). Indeed, in these earlier letters Descartes frequently asserts that the eternal truths are not independent of God: "As for the eternal truths, I say once more that they are true or possible only because God knows them as true or possible. They are not known as true by God in any way which would imply that they are true independent of him", and "so we must not say that if God did not exist nevertheless these truths would be true" (To Mersenne, 6 May 1630; CSMK III 24). Hence, the context of the discussion in the letter from 27 May 1638 involves the hypothetical situation where God "created nothing", and the contention is that not only would space not exist, but none of the eternal truths would exist either "if God had not so established". Smith's reading of this passage is thus not supportable: Descartes is grouping space with the other eternal truths here (presumably as geometric truths), whereas it is rather awkward to translate his use of the term 'space' as specifically designating matter, as Smith does. Put differently (as suggested by a colleague), if we accept Smith's interpretation of this quote, then Descartes is claiming that even the non-mathematical eternal truths (such as "the whole is greater than the part") depend on the existence of matter, and that seems far-fetched (since the cited eternal truth must apply to incorporeal substance as well as the corporeal).

Likewise, there are many other quotations that can be offered that would seem to undermine Smith's claim that matter is necessary for the intelligibility of mathematics. In the Fifth Meditation, he comments that "I find within me countless ideas of things which even though they may not exist anywhere outside me still cannot be called nothing", and "when, for example, I imagine a triangle, even if perhaps no such figure exists, or has ever existed, anywhere outside of my thought, there is still a determinate nature, or essence, or form of the triangle which is immutable and eternal, and not invented by me or dependent on my mind" (CSM II 44-45). Concerning a similar quotation in the First Meditation (CSM II 14), Smith replies (p. 117) that this may not be Descartes' actual position (that mathematics is intelligible apart from all matter) since the existence of the evil genius is still in play at this stage in the work. Yet, by the Fifth Meditation the evil genius has largely been vanquished. Moreover, Descartes argues for our certain knowledge of the existence of God via analogies with our certain knowledge of mathematical truths -- and, of course, the corporeal world has not been proven at this point in the Meditations either, contra Smith's main thesis. Finally, Smith offers the argument that mathematics requires matter because the divisibility required for mathematics can only be obtained from Descartes' divisible, corporeal substance, whereas his notion of thinking substance is indivisible (p. 281). But this once again seems to run together epistemological and ontological issues pertaining to mathematics (and substances).

To follow up on some of these last points, what is interesting about Descartes' approach to mathematics is that, while he remains a nominalist about mathematical entities (as noted above), he holds a Platonist conception of the understanding or psychology of mathematical truths (for lack of a better term). That is, in true Platonist fashion, Descartes argues against Gassendi's abstractionist conception of geometry in the Fifth Set of Replies, contending instead that "we could not recognize the geometrical triangle from the diagram on the paper unless our mind already possessed the idea from some other source" (i.e., "the idea of the true triangle was already in us": CSM II 262). In other words, since Descartes accepts a nominalism about mathematical entities alongside a Platonism concerning the understanding of the eternal truths of mathematics, one can therefore possess and grasp those eternal truths even if they are only made manifest in corporeal substance, or fail to be instantiated at all. It should be noted, however, that this mixture of Platonism and Aristotelianism in Descartes' thought is discussed at times (e.g., pp. 24-25), and Smith does explore a distinction between our intellectual grasp of mathematics and the mathematical nature of matter (a distinction he dubs "intelligible" and "sensible" matter; e.g., p. 237). Part of the reason for Smith's quest to bi-conditionally link the existence of matter to mathematics, it would seem, is to counter the skeptical worries that are addressed in Part IV, where, for instance, Michael Friedman's arguments that severe the tie between intelligible and sensible matter for Descartes are explored (pp. 237-240). Smith offers a transcendental argument, modeled on Kant, in an effort to counter these types of interpretations (pp. 267-278), but it must be admitted that this sort of strategy just does not seem supportable given the lack of textual evidence (or, at least, I remain skeptical).

Turning to Leibniz, Smith reckons that matter is necessary for his mathematics as well, although he offers fewer specific arguments. One tentative suggestion is that, for Leibniz, "number and shape are not perfections, and so are not attributes of God", from which he infers that "in a world where God is the only thing, numbers and shapes are nowhere to be found" (p. 282). Nonetheless, this is quite hard to reconcile with a number of passages, such as the following from the Discourse on Metaphysics: "the eternal truths of metaphysics and geometry … are rather the consequences of his [God's] understanding".[2] The main focus of Smith's attempt to link mathematics and matter in Leibniz involves the monads, however. In a nice summery, he contends that "if the monad is taken to be analogous to the Euclidean point, and God creates a multitude of monads … , and a relational nexus emerges necessarily among them, matter can be understood as arising from God's creating the multitude of monads" (p. 282). How mathematics ties into this story is unclear, but there are substantial grounds for rejecting the assumption that extended matter necessarily arises from the monads (e.g., in the correspondence with Des Bosses[3], a materially unextended world with monads is indeed contemplated, although the unextended primary matter of the monads remains).

On the whole, there are a number of interesting and informative discussions in the portions of the book dedicated to Leibniz, including a number of useful analogies regarding the monadic system: Smith hints at information theory and puts the combinatoric component of Leibniz's theory to good use by suggesting many other contemporary analogies. On the debit side, Smith offers something like a group theoretic interpretation of the monads, tentatively comparing them to the points of a vector space, etc. (p. 178). Yet, Leibniz is clear that monads are not spatial ("there is no spatial or absolute nearness or distance among monads", Loemker, p. 607), so such analogies run a serious risk of imposing too much structure on Leibniz' conception (and these sorts of interpretations have been suggested by many previous commentators as well).

In general, the above criticisms should not be taken as constituting a negative review of Smith's book. There is much that is valuable and noteworthy in this provocative work, and it will likely engender a reevaluation by scholars of many well trodden and seldom questioned aspects of Descartes' and Leibniz's methodological systems. While I may have not been won over by various arguments put forward in the book, the journey on which Smith leads his reader is well worth the time and investment and will likely aid in drawing the attention of many early modern scholars to these important and fertile issues for further research.

[1] Rene Descartes, The Philosophical Writings of Descartes, 3 vols, vols. 1-2: Cottingham, Stoothoff, Murdoch, eds., Cambridge, 1984; vol. 3: Cottingham et al., eds., Cambridge, 1991.

[2] Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Philosophical Papers and Letters, Loemker, ed., Dordrecht, 1969, p. 304.

[3] Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Philosophical Essays, Ariew and Garber, eds., Hackett, 1989, p. 206.