Matters of Spirit: J.G. Fichte and the Technological Imagination

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F. Scott Scribner, Matters of Spirit: J.G. Fichte and the Technological Imagination, The Pennsylvania State University Press, 2010, 205pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271036212.

Reviewed by Michael Baur, Fordham University


In recent years, philosophers have recognized the richness and contemporary relevance of J.G. Fichte's philosophy. Arguably, it was Dieter Henrich who initiated this pro-Fichte trend when (in his 1967 work, "Fichte's Original Insight") he argued that Fichte identified a serious shortcoming in all so-called philosophies of "reflection." All philosophies of reflection are flawed since they presume that a conscious subject's knowledge of itself is representational in character, when in fact all representation presupposes that the subject is already possessed of a non-representational kind of self-knowledge. If the subject were not already possessed of such non-representational self-knowledge, then the subject would not be in a position to ascribe its representations to itself rather than to some object other than itself.

More recently, philosophers have mined Fichte's thought for further insights which shed light on contemporary problems and their possible resolution. Axel Honneth has argued that Fichte's innovative account of a "summons" (Aufforderung) between free selves importantly anticipates key elements of the theory of communicative action as it is found in contemporary critical social theory. In a similar vein, Stephen Darwall has argued that Fichte's notion of intersubjective recognition is an illuminating precursor to his own theory of how the "second-person standpoint" plays an essential role in moral reasoning and moral decision-making. In Matters of Spirit, F. Scott Scribner adds to the recent literature on the originality and contemporary significance of Fichte's philosophy. Scribner accepts the basic premise of Henrich's Fichte-interpretation, but then goes on to argue that the Fichtean critique of reflection opens up a new set of questions about the role of the imagination (Einbildungskraft) in Fichte's thought, and about the susceptibility of the imagination to possible usurpation by technological means of image-production. These concerns allow Scribner to bring Fichte into fruitful dialogue with later continental thinkers such as Michel Henry, Walter Benjamin, Theodor Adorno, and Martin Heidegger.

Scribner's accomplishment in this book is important and original. He has an impressive knowledge of the entirety of Fichte's philosophy, and of the relevance of Fichte's thought to later developments in nineteenth- and twentieth-century continental philosophy. He has made a complex, compelling, and challenging case for reading Fichte's thought in general, and in particular Fichte's thought about the centrality of the imagination, in light of later philosophical worries about the technologization of the imagination. Interestingly, the great strengths of Scribner's book -- its erudition, its scope, and its relevance -- are linked to the book's main weakness. Scribner, immersed as he is in Fichtean and post-Fichtean continental philosophy, relies often on the technical terminology (some might call it jargon) that permeates a great deal of contemporary discourse in continental philosophy. Because of this, his account -- as original and insightful as it is -- will be less than clear and convincing to readers who are not already familiar with Fichte's thought and with later developments in continental philosophy.

What follows is an attempt to re-state the broad outlines of Fichte's contribution, as discussed by Scribner. In his Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre (1794/95), Fichte argues for what has been called (following Brentano and Husserl) the "intentional" character of all consciousness. For Fichte, all consciousness is intentional, which is to say that a subject is conscious only to the extent that something that counts as an instance of "otherness" appears to the subject as an instance of otherness (or as an "object"). But, Fichte goes on to argue, nothing can appear as an instance of otherness to the subject, if this otherness were not related to the subject and thus if this otherness did not render the subject finite or limited. On Fichte's account, then, that which renders the subject conscious is also that which renders the subject finite. For Fichte, there can be no such thing as a conscious subject which is not also a finite subject (it follows from this that the idea of a conscious, infinite, personal God is unintelligible for Fichte, just as it was for Spinoza). In Fichte's Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslhere, the otherness which appears as an otherness to the subject and thus which renders the subject both conscious and finite, is called the "nicht-ich" or "not-I."

In his Foundations of Natural Right (1795/96), Fichte goes on to argue that it is impossible to conceive of this finitizing not-I as something that operates merely in accordance with the causal-mechanistic laws governing the interactions of objects within space and time. This is because the not-I must render the subject finite, yet without destroying the subject's free and rational nature. If the not-I were thought to operate merely in accordance with causal-mechanistic laws, then it would be impossible to conceive how the not-I could determine (i.e., cause) the subject to be finite and yet also allow the subject to remain free (uncaused). It is necessary, says Fichte, to conceive of the not-I not merely as an instance of otherness that causally determines the subject to be finite; it is necessary to conceive of the not-I as another I which -- precisely because its actions are not governed by causal-mechanistic laws alone -- is able to determine the subject to be self-determining. Thus for Fichte, the not-I must be conceived as another I which "calls" the subject to free and conscious selfhood by means of a primordial "summons" (Aufforderung) to enter into a relationship of reciprocal recognition. For Fichte, then, the condition of the possibility of the existence of any free, rational, conscious self is the existence of an intersubjective relationship in which at least two selves interact and reciprocally recognize one another as free. The relationship by means of which they do so is called a relationship of right or rightfulness (Recht).

It is Fichte's argument about the necessity of intersubjective interaction and recognition which gives rise to a central problem addressed in Scriber's book. If intersubjective interaction is the condition of the possibility of the existence of any free, rational, and conscious selfhood, then on what grounds can there be communication between the selves which interact and reciprocally recognize one another? Such communication is necessary, since without it no reciprocal interaction or recognition between free selves would be possible. But this communication cannot be achieved on the basis of any deliberate and conscious acts undertaken by the interacting selves, since on Fichte's account it is this very act of primordial communication which makes possible the existence of free and conscious selfhood in the first place.

As Scribner shows, Fichte had begun to address this question in his Foundations of the Entire Wissenschaftslehre, when he argued that it is by means of the imagination ("an absolute activity that determines reciprocity") that the subject maintains an oscillation (Schweben) between itself and the not-I and thereby posits itself as the finite (self-striving and self-limiting) subject that it is. In the Foundations of Natural Right, the important oscillation or interaction to be explained is no longer one between the I and the not-I, but rather one between one I and another I. And so in the Foundations of Natural Right, the crucial task is no longer to show how a reciprocity between I and not-I takes place by means of the imagination, but rather how a reciprocal interaction and communication takes place between one I and another I. For Fichte, the two selves communicate -- they mutually influence one another but in a way that is "free of the necessities of causality" (p. 134) -- by means of what is called "subtle matter." As Scribner admirably shows, "subtle matter" in Fichte's Foundations of Natural Right can be interpreted as a kind of "materialization" or "exteriorization" of the imagination as portrayed in Fichte's earlier work, and thus might be understood on the model of Kant's notion of aesthetic judgment. Fichte's quasi-materialization of the imagination also opens the way towards what Scribner calls the "first displacement" in Fichte's thinking about the imagination. This first displacement is marked by Fichte's shift (at the end of his Wissenschaftslehre period) from thinking about the imagination as a faculty of the subject to thinking about it as the non-subjective, transparent locus for the self-manifestation of Being as such. With this first displacement, Scribner suggests, Fichte's thought moves interestingly into the vicinity of Heidegger's later ruminations about the question of Being and the possibility of metaphysics.

On Scribner's reading, the first displacement in Fichte's thinking about the imagination was soon to be threatened by a "second displacement." This second displacement consists in a shift of focus from the externalization of the imagination (as already affirmed in the first displacement) to the technologization of the imagination. With this second displacement, Fichte's attempt at a non-subjectivistic metaphysics of spirit (and thus his attempt at raising anew the question of Being) stood in danger of becoming appropriated and usurped by the material technology of image-production. For Scribner, one can discern just how Fichte sought to grapple with this insidious possibility by attending to Fichte's theoretical interests in, and later resistance to, the phenomenon of "magnetic psychology" or mesmerism. According to the theory of magnetic psychology, the entire physical world was permeated by a kind of quasi-material fluid substance (something akin to Fichte's own "subtle matter") which allowed spirits to communicate with one another and thus bring about the restoration of individual health and social harmony. As Scribner points out, Fichte actually attended a firsthand demonstration of the technique of magnetic psychology (September 14, 1813, to be exact) and kept a private diary (which he never intended to publish) on the topic of animal magnetism (this was Fichte's 1813 "Tagebuch über den animalischen Magnetismus").

According to Scribner, Fichte was attracted to the phenomenon of magnetic psychology since it seemed to provide him with a "material proof" of his externalized theory of the imagination, or spirit. But Fichte later resisted the theory of magnetic psychology or magnetic rapport, since -- according to Scribner -- he realized "that this technique of rapport was a material technology that threatened to overcome and transform the very metaphysics it was first intended to prove" (180-181). But in confronting the possible technologization of the imagination, Scribner argues, Fichte was at least able to broach some of the basic questions that were later to be addressed by Walter Benjamin in "The Work of Art in the Age of Mechanical Reproduction" (1936) and by Martin Heidegger in "The Age of the World Picture" (1938).

Scribner's arguments regarding the "second displacement" in Fichte's thought may strike some readers as being insufficiently documented; and his account of an aestheticized doctrine of intersubjective recognition in Fichte may seem to some as being overly speculative. But even if doubts such as these remain unabated, there can be little doubt that Scribner has provided us with an illuminating and original account that does justice to the broad outlines of Fichte's philosophy, and at the same time demonstrates Fichte's lasting relevance for us today.