Maurice Blanchot and Fragmentary Writing: A Change of Epoch

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Leslie Hill, Maurice Blanchot and Fragmentary Writing: A Change of Epoch, Continuum, 2012, 400pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441166227.

Reviewed by Gerald Bruns, University of Notre Dame


Perhaps the first thing to say about "fragmentary writing" is that it is an instance of what Deleuze and Guattari call "nomad art": multilinear forms that defeat the application of definitions, concepts, or conventional fixations of any kind.[1] The word "fragment" is basically a covering term for textual variables in a constant state of variation -- citations (or ruins) from antiquity, mnemonic forms like aphorisms, anecdotes, and pensées, as well as such random staples as notebook entries, tombstone epitaphs, and snatches of conversation. The prudent scholar will have consulted the early German Romantics, particularly Friedrich Schlegel, arguably the first philosopher of the fragmentary, for whom formal logic and systematic thinking are "philosophical grotesques."[2] As Jean-Luc Nancy and François Lacoue-Labarthe observe, "The fragment . . . involves an essential incompletion," an endless deferral of anything resembling a resolution of elements or events, whether in the form of an Aristotelian unity or a Hegelian totality.[3] Of course, Nancy and Lacoue-Labarthe make this point only to show how Schlegel himself, in Fr. 201, seems to reverse it: "A fragment, like a miniature work of art, has to be entirely isolated from the surrounding world and be complete in itself like a porcupine." To which a Schlegelian might respond by saying that the "true" fragment, contradictions be damned, is something absolutely singular and irreducible, refractory to contexts and inventories. The fragment is, whatever else it is, a figure of freedom.

More than one student of Romanticism has traced genealogical lines from Schlegel through Emerson and Nietzsche to the writings of the later Heidegger and, eventually, to the French writer Maurice Blanchot (1907-2003).[4] Following the romantic model, almost any awakening of interest in Hegel will produce (according to Hegelian rules) a countervailing "fragmentary demand," and this seems to have been the case at a critical point in Blanchot's career when Jean Hyppolite, Jean Wahl, and Alexandre Kojève brought Hegel's writings into the play of 20th-century French intellectual life.

For example, in "Littérature et la droit à la mort," an essay written shortly after the publication in 1947 of Kojève's famous Hegel lectures (1933-39), Blanchot developed a conception of writing as a strategic interruption of Hegel's dialectic -- at least Kojève's version of it.[5] As Blanchot says in a footnote, Kojève "demonstrates in a remarkable way how comprehension for Hegel was equivalent to murder," meaning that predication annihilates the singularity of things (or persons) by replacing them with concepts.[6] To which Blanchot applies this gloss: "Everyday language [la langage courant] calls a cat a cat, as if the living cat and its name were identical, as if it were not true that when we name the cat, we retain nothing of it but its absence, what it is not." (PF314/WF325).[7]

In contrast to this lethal discursiveness, literary language seeks to save the cat by materializing itself, disrupting its discursive operations ("say nothing, speak in order to say nothing") by turning words back into things (PF314/WF324). Imagine a piece of writing in which a name

ceases to be the ephemeral passing of nonexistence and becomes a concrete ball, a solid mass of existence; language, abandoning the sense, the meaning that is all it wanted to be, tries to become senseless [le langage, quittant ce sense qu'il voulait être uniquement, cherche à se faire insensé]. Everything physical takes precedence: rhythm, weight, mass, shape, and then the paper on which one writes, the trail of the ink, the book. Yes, happily language is a thing: it is a written thing, a bit of bark, a sliver of rock, a fragment of clay in which the reality of the earth continues to exist (PF316-17/WF327).

By way of example Blanchot mentions Mallarmé and Francis Ponge, poets for whom words are no longer forms of mediation or substitutes for mundane objects. But actual examples fall short of what Blanchot is after, namely a kind writing that preserves "the strangeness of that existence which . . . does not fit into any category" (PF327/WF340).

The thesis of Leslie Hill's book is that during the 1950s Blanchot pursued this strangeness by turning away from the discursive prose of his early fiction toward the fragmentary writing ofL'Attente, l'Oubli (1962), La Pas au-delà (1973), and L'Écriture du désastre (1980).[8] Hill devotes a lengthy chapter to each of these texts, not so much to give them close philological attention as to contextualize them within Blanchot's readings of (principally) Nietzsche, Heidegger and Emmanuel Levinas.  There are liberal references along the way to Blanchot's own critical writings from the 1950s and '60s, which, after considerable revision, Blanchot gathered together in L'Entretien infini (1969) -- a text that begins with a series of fragments of narrative and dialogue that introduce a nameless but characteristically aged interlocutor who "has lost the power to express himself in a continuous manner."[9] And as if speaking on behalf (or in place) of this interlocutor the essays that follow attempt to gain some conceptual purchase on what Blanchot, in one of his Nietzsche essays, calls "a non-dialectical experience of speech" (EI90/IC63).[10]

Or, much to the same point, a non-dialectical experience of time. The ancients are thought to have distinguished between two kinds of time -- the time of Chronos, which proceeds consecutively, and the time of Aion, which pauses interminably: for example, the time of waiting, suffering, and forgetting, as when one is caught up (or merely caught) in a moment from which the past recedes into what never happened and the future holds itself in abeyance.[11] In "Le grand refus" (1959), Blanchot figures it as a time of impossibility, of which there are several traits, in the first of which "time changes direction, no longer offering itself out of the future as what gathers by going beyond; time, here, is rather the dispersion of a present that, even while being only passage does not pass [la dispersion du present qui ne passe, tout en n'étant que passage], never fixes itself in a present, refers to no past and goes toward no future: the incessant" (EI64-65/IC45).

This is the temporality which L'Attente, l'Oubli explores, not only with its attenuated narrative of a conversation between a man and a woman whose words never quite get through to one another, but especially in its paradoxical wordplay (if "play" is the word) --

Attendre, seulement attendre. L'attente, étrangère, égale en tous ses moments, comme l'espace en tous ses points, pareille à l'espace, exerçant la même pression continue, ne l'exerçant pas. L'attente solitare, qui était en nous et maintenant passé au dehors, attente de nous sans nous, nous forçant à attendre hors de notre proper attente, ne nous laissant plus rien à attendre. D'abord l'intimité, d'abord l'ignorance de l'intimité, d'abord le côte à côte d'instants s'ignorant, se touchant et sans rapport.

To wait, only wait. Waiting, strange, equal in all of its moments, as space is in all of its points, similar to space, exerting the same continuous pressure, not exerting it. Lonely waiting, which was in us and has now passed to the outside, waiting for us without us, forcing us to wait outside our own waiting, leaving nothing more to wait for. At first intimacy, at first ignorance of intimacy, at first ignorant moments side by side, touching and without relation. [12]

The fragment turns reading itself into a kind of waiting by its refusal to come to a point, proceeding as it does by turning back on itself in defiance of the law of non-contradiction ("touching and without relation"). In the bargain it makes all of us players in the book's interminable conversation, with its refractory imperative: "Exprimer cela seulement qui ne peut être. Le laisser inexprimé" ("Express only that which cannot be expressed. Leave it unexpressed)" (35/16).

Meanwhile Hill emphasizes the importance of Blanchot's reading of Nietzsche in Le Pas au delà, with its displacement of the concept of Eternal Return away from any rule of identity toward a present that time cannot traverse:

Let there be a past, let there be a future, with nothing that would allow the passage from one to the other . . . .

The law of the return supposing that "everything" would come again, seems to take time as completed: the circle out of circulation of all circles; but, in as much as it breaks the ring in the middle [pour autant qu'elle rompt l'anneau en son milieu], it proposes a time not uncompleted, but, on the contrary, finite, except in the present point that alone we think we hold, and that, lacking, introduces rupture into infinity, making us live as in a state of perpetual death [nous obligeant à vivre comme en état de mort perpétuelle].[13]

Living a perpetual death: that is, neither alive nor dead but enduring the solitary interval of no longer/not yet, the temporality of dying -- and of writing, where writing achieves (if that is the word) "an arrangement that does not compose but juxtaposes, that is to say, leaves each of the terms that come into relation outside one another, respecting and preserving this exteriority as the principle -- always already undercut [destitué] -- of all signification." To which Blanchot adds a crafty afterthought: "Juxtaposition and interruption here assume an extraordinary force of justice. Here all freedom finds its order on the basis of the (uneasy) ease it accords us" (EI453/IC308). Who would have figured Blanchot as a philosopher of freedom?[14]

Likewise the question that studies of Blanchot continue to leave open is whether, or in what ways, exactly, Blanchot's own fragmentary practices live up to the strictness of his theory.[15] Hill wisely remarks on the irreducibility of Le Pas au delà to genre descriptions of any sort, much less whether Blanchot's writing can be counted as either literature or philosophy (pp. 216-31), and he has some good pages on the Kabbalah-like complexity of Blanchot's typographical variations and devices -- for example: the four-sided icon  that marks the beginning of each fragment, and which Hill links with the predominance of the number four in L'Écriture du désastre (pp. 285-97). But Hill is rather more a historian (and archivist) than critic; his interest remains less in the poetics than in the upshot of Blanchot's later writings. He proposes that, for all of their rhetorical complexity, the fragments that compose both Le Pas au delà and L'Écriture du désastre never lose their "aboutness," largely because, as Hill makes clear, Blanchot is always in a give-and-take with his antecedents and contemporaries, and that, in particular, questions concerning Blanchot's politics -- his right-wing writings of the 1930s, his opposition to the policies of De Gaulle during the Algerian crisis, his position with respect to 1968 and its aftermath, and especially his later preoccupation with Judaism and the Holocaust -- continue to demand close attention to the nuances of historical context (see Hill, pp. 329-91).

Hill makes a special point of this with respect to L'Écriture du désastre, whose superabundance of terms beginning with the prefix - makes it sound as if the book were composed according to some echo principle. But Hill insists that the work "is no verbal playground luxuriating in the dubious spectacle of preciosity masquerading as thought, as readers of some of Blanchot's later texts translated into English might occasionally legitimately wonder" (p. 299). Hill prefers to think of Blanchot as a "spectral" phenomenologist of limit-experiences (p. 308): not just the events of waiting and forgetting, but also (responding to the Levinas's De l'existence à l'existant [1947]), fatigue, insomnia, and passivity:

Passivity. We can evoke situations of passivity: affliction [le malheur], the final crushing force of the totalitarian State with its camps [le état concentrationaire], the servitude of the slave bereft of a master, fallen beneath need; or dying, as forgetfulness of death [le mourir comme l'inattention à l'issue mortelle]. In all these cases we recognize, even though with a falsifying, approximating knowledge, common traits: anonymity, loss of self; loss of all sovereignty but also of all subordination; utter uprootedness [le perte du séjour], exile [le erreur sans lieu], the impossibility of presence, dispersion (separation) (ED34/WD17-18).

Note: "We can evoke situations of passivity," but the thing itself leaves us speechless; or, more exactly, leaves our words in disarray. Passivity in this respect is disastrous in the special sense that Blanchot gives this word: "The disaster, inexperienced [inéxperimenté]. It is what escapes the very possibility of experience -- it is the limit of writing" (ED17/WD7). Likewise with respect to the (unnamable) Holocaust: "How can it be preserved even by thought? How can thought be made the keeper of the holocaust where all was lost, including guardian thought?" (ED80/WD47).

One might read L'Écriture du désastre as an extended, recursive response to the impossibility of this question, as in the fragment on "refusal" ("the first degree of passivity") in which Blanchot invokes his hero and prototype, Herman Melville's Bartleby the Scrivener, whose celebrated line, "I would prefer not to," is not a willful line drawn in the sand but a simple abdication of the position of the logical subject: "Bartleby gives up . . . ever saying anything; he gives up the authority to speak. This is abnegation understood as the abandonment of the self, a relinquishment of identity, refusal which does not cleave to refusal [le refus de soi qui ne se crispe pas sur le refus] but opens to failure, to the loss of being, to thought" (ED33/WD17). Fragmentary writing is a form of Bartleby's abdication, a refusal of (among other things) the law of non-contradiction, for it is by way of contradiction that Blanchot frees his writing from the law of closure -- as he more or less straightforwardly affirms in this fragment from Le Pas au delà (which has always sounded to me like a dialogue between an insidious Blanchot and a flustered Hegel):

"I refuse this speech by which you speak to me, this discourse that you offer me to attract me to it in calming me, the time in which your successive words last, in which you hold me back in the presence of an affirmation, is above all this relation that you create between us just by the fact that you address speech to me even in my silence." -- "Who are you?" -- "The refusal to take part in discourse, to make a pact with a law of discourse." -- "Do you prefer tears, laughter, immobile madness?" -- "I speak, but I do not speak in your discourse: I do not let you, speaking, speak, I force you to speak not speaking [je t'oblige à parler ne parlant pas]; there is no help for you, no instant in which you rest from me, I who am there in all your words before all your words." -- "I have invented the great logos of logic that protects me from your incursions and allows me to speak and to know in speaking through the peace of well developed words" -- "But I am there in your logic also, denouncing the oppression of a coherence that makes itself the law and I am there with my violence that affirms itself under the mask of your legal violence, that which submits thought to the grip of comprehension" (PD159-69/SNB116-17).

Imagine Hegel confronting (at midnight) his "inner Blanchot" -- a speaking or writing that "sympathizes with darkness, with aimless passion, with lawless violence, with everything in the world that seems to perpetuate the refusal to come into the world . . . and says nothing, reveals nothing, simply announces -- through its refusal to say anything -- that it comes from the night and will return to the night" (PF319/WF330).

Hill prefers to think of "the encounter between philosophy and the fragmentary" as neutral, neither "one of continuity nor indeed . . . one of opposition" (p. 322), since these are, after all, dialectical terms. Better to think of the fragmentary as "the travesty [l'imposture] of the System" (ED100/WD61), which would be one way of reading the fragment just cited -- a parody of the Master-Slave duet, and arguably the closest Blanchot ever came to a piece of comic writing. The question remains whether Blanchot's later writings do not themselves remain precursors -- "The fragmentary imperative calls upon us to sense that there is as yet nothing fragmentary, not properly speaking, but improperly speaking" (ED102/WD62) -- for they remain properly discursive, theoretical, and, for all their paradoxes, eminently readable. The radical materialization of language called for in "Littérature et la droit à la mort" -- words thickening into things -- never really materializes in Blanchot's work. On this point Hill would probably refer us to the later fictions of Samuel Beckett, whereas I would nominate the contemporary British poet J. H. Prynne as the last word in fragmentary writing:

Profuse reclaim from a scrape or belt, funnel do

axial parenthood block the mustard dots briefly

act forward, their age layer for layer in this

tied-off accession. Appellate at dictum at

its debit resonance fixing proclusion, optic rage

performs even dots right now. This is the top

passion play and counted out for renewal patch,

allergic his dispute braving off. Make a dot

difference, make an offer; these feeling spray-on

skin products are uninhabitable, by field and stream.

Tell us, only for as many as crowd in through

the door to the diluvium, the romance of the new

organic dyscrasia vibrato fretting its early bits

on release on ambit. Early grief, late woe ahead.[16]

[1] Gilles Deleuze and Felix GuattariA Thousand Plateaus: Capitalism and Schizophrenia, trans. Brian Massumi (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1987), pp. 492-500.

[2] "Atheneum Fragments" (Fr. 75), Philosophical Fragments, trans. Peter Firchow (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1991), p. 27. The paradox, or irony, is that without these "grotesques" the fragment would be entirely without force (or irony).  See Fr. 53: "It is equally fatal for the mind to have a system and to have none. It will simply have to decide to combine the two."

[3] See The Literary Absolute: The Theory of Literature in German Romanticism, trans. Philip Barnard and Cheryl Lester (Albany: SUNY Press, 1988), p. 42.

[4] See Christopher Strathman, The Fragmentary Imperative: Schlegel, Byron, Joyce, Blanchot (Albany: SUNY Press, 2006); and William S. Allen, Ellipses: Of Poetry and the Experience of Language after Heidegger, Hölderlin, and Blanchot (Albany: SUNY Press, 2007), esp. 193-220. See also Dan Mellamphy, "Fragmentality (thinking the fragment)," Dalhousie French Review, 45 (November 1988): 82-98; and Steven Ungar, "Parts and Holes: Heraclitus/Nietzsche/Blanchot," SubStance, 14 (1976): 126-41.

[5] See Kojève, Introduction to the Reading of Hegel, ed. Philip Queneau, trans. James H. Nichols, Jr. (Ithaca: Cornell University Press, 1980), p. 201: "The being which negates the given real dialectically also preserves it as negated—that is, as unreal or 'ideal': it preserves what is negated as the 'meaning' of the discourse by which it reveals it. Hence it is 'conscious' of what it negates." See also pp. 220-24, on the negation of nature as the condition of being human. Kojève’s best line, however, occurs much earlier: "According to Hegel, the animal realizes and reveals itssuperiority to plants by eating them" (p. 39).

[6] La Part du feu (Paris: Gallimard, 1949), p. 312 (hereafter PF);"Literature and the Right to Death," trans. Lydia Davis, The Work of Fire (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 1995), p. 322 (hereafter WF). See my discussion of Blanchot’s essay in “Language and Power,” Chicago Review, 34, no. 2 (1984): 27-48. Compare Heidegger, "Letter on Humanism," on speech as an instrument of domination by which man distances himself from the being of things. Accordingly, "If the human being is to find his way once again into the nearness of being, he must first learn to exist in the nameless." Pathmarks, trans. William McNeill (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), p. 243. See also Rodolphe Gasché, "The Felicities of Paradox: Maurice Blanchot on the Null-Space of Literature," Maurice Blanchot: The Demand of Writing, ed. Carolyn Bailey Gill (London: Routledge, 1996), pp. 35-69.

[7] See Kojève on naming things: "this table is the table of which I am speaking at this moment, and my words are as much a part of this table as are its four legs or the room which surrounds it" (Introduction to the Reading of Hegel, p. 212). Then, by contrast, see René Char’s "Marmonnement" ("Mumbling"): "Loup, je t’appelle, mais tu n’as pas de réalité nommable. De plus, tu es inintelligible" Les Matinaux, suivi de La parole en archipel (Paris: Gallimard, 1987), p. 133

[8] Hill’s book is something of a supplement to his Blanchot: Extreme Contemporary (London: Routledge, 1997), which devotes relatively few pages to Blanchot’s later writings. For more on the early Blanchot, see Hill’s Bataille, Klossowski, Blanchot: Writing at the Limit (New York: Oxford University Press, 2001).

[9] L’Entretien infini (Paris: Gallimard, 1969), pp. xxii-xxiii (hereafter EI); The Infinite Conversation, trans. Susan Hanson (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1993), p. xxi (hereafter IC)

[10] See principally the essays in Part III: L’Absence de Livre ("le neutre, le fragmentaire"), especially “Parole de fragment,” an essay on the poet René Char (EI451-58/IC307-13).

[11] See Gilles Deleuze, The Logic of Sense, trans. Mark Lester (New York: Columbia University Press, 1990), pp. 60-63; and John Sellars, "Chronos and Aiôn: Deleuze and the Stoic Theory of Time," COLLAPSE III (November, 2007): 177-205.

[12] L’Attente, l’Oubli (Paris: Gallimard, 1962), p. 31; Awaiting, Oblivion, trans. John Gregg (Lincoln: University of Nebraska Press, 1997), p. 14. See Emmanuel Levinas’s essay on L’Attente,l’Oubli, "The Servant and Her Master" (1966), Proper Names, trans. Michael B. Smith (Stanford University Press, 1996), pp. 140-49, esp. p. 148, where he describes Blanchot’s language as a "language of pure transcendence without correlation—like the waiting that nothing awaited yet destroys—noesis without noema—pure extra-vagance, a language going from one singularity to another without their having anything in common." Hill rightly observes that L’Attente, l’Oubli is saturated with the "self-displaced motifs" of waiting and forgetting, whose repetition features a schoolmaster’s list of rhetorical figures: "Paronomasia, ellipsis, oxymoron, chiasmus, paradox, all loom large in their articulation" (p. 134). On this point, see Unger, "Parts and Wholes": 136-37 (note 4 above).

[13] (Paris: Gallimard, 1973), p. 22; The Step Not Beyond, trans. Lycette Nelson (Albany: SUNY Press, 1992), p. 12). See Hill, pp. 191-216, esp. p. 210, where Hill glosses this passage (in part) as follows:

An unthematised and unthematisable interruption remained, suggesting that the present, while no longer a moment of presence (or absence, the effect of which would be the same), nevertheless corresponded to a disjunction or interval, a finite trace traversed by the infinite and an ungraspable limit opening onto the limitless, in much the same way that death, this always imminent and always certain finality, might give way to the interminable suspension of dying which no experience in the present can comprehend.

[14] Following "Littérature et la droit à la mort," freedom for Blanchot would not be a Kantian freedom of the subject but the ontological freedom of things from the subject’s conceptual grasp—the freedom of non-identity. Compare Heidegger’s notion of Gelassenheit, "Letting-Be," Discourse on Thinking, trans. John M. Anderson and E. Hans Freund (New York: Harper & Row, 1966). See Fred Dallmayer "Ontology of Freedom: Heidegger and Political Philosophy," Politics and Praxis: Exercises in Contemporary Political Theory (Cambridge: MIT Press, 1984), pp. 104-32, esp. pp. 116-17; and Gerald L. Bruns, "Blanchot/Celan: Unterwegssein (On Poetry and Freedom)", Maurice Blanchot: The Refusal of Philosophy (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1997), pp. 88-95.

[15] Blanchot speaks of an "arrangement" that juxtaposes rather than composes, but his own fragments rarely take the paratactic form that has characterized so much of modern and contemporary innovative writing since Gertrude Stein’s Tender Buttons (1914):


Colored hats are necessary to show that curls are worn by an addition of blank spaces, this makes the difference between single lines and broad stomachs, the least thing is lightening, the least thing means a little flower and a big delay a big delay that makes more nurses than little women really little women.

(Los Angeles: Sun & Moon Press, n.d.), p. 24. See Jean-François Lyotard on phrases that "obey other regimens than the logical and the cognitive," in The Differend: Phrases in Dispute, trans. Georges Van Den Abbeele (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1988), pp. 65-67; and Heidegger on parataxis as the saying of "thinking," What is Called Thinking?, trans. J. Glenn Gray (New York: Harper & Row, 1968), pp. 182-193, esp. p. 186.

[16] From "Unanswering Rational Shore" (2001), Poems, 2nd ed. (Northumberland: Bloodaxe Books, 2005), p. 519. See Leslie Hill, Beckett’s Fiction in Different Words (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1990).