Maurice Blondel: A Philosophical Life

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Oliva Blanchette, Maurice Blondel: A Philosophical Life, Eerdmans, 2010, 820pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780802863652.

Reviewed by Peter J. Bernardi, S.J., Loyola University, Chicago


This volume is the most comprehensive study of Maurice Blondel's philosophical career and writings to appear in any language. Its publication in the Ressourcement: Retrieval and Renewal in Catholic Thought series, edited by David L. Schindler, is indeed an "event." Oliva Blanchette, professor of philosophy at Boston College since 1964 and an accomplished philosopher in his own right (e.g., Philosophy of Being: A Reconstructive Essay in Metaphysics, CUA Press, 2003), has brought to fruition a lifetime of study of Blondel's philosophy of action that began at Louvain, Belgium, in the early 1950s. In 1984, Blanchette's translation of Blondel's L'Action was published (reissued in paperback in 2004). Rendering Blondel's difficult style into English was no mean achievement and, together with several scholarly studies of Blondel's thought that Blanchette has published over the years, prepared him for this crowning achievement. Furthermore, at an earlier stage of his research, Blanchette had the benefit of consulting with Nathalie Panis who was in a unique position to know Blondel's thinking and intentions. As Blondel's "faithful disciple and collaboratrix," she enabled him to produce his mature works after he was disabled by blindness. This volume is dedicated to her.

Blanchette's tome is divided into two parts, entitled "The Journey Inward" and "The Systematic Summation." Part one (chapters 1-10) illuminates the genesis and development of Blondel's philosophical vocation and then relates the context and the content of Blondel's work, beginning with the original L'Action (1893) up to and including his defense of his notion of "Catholic" philosophy in the early 1930s. While focusing on Blondel's published writings, some of which appeared pseudonymously, Blanchette also draws on archival materials, correspondence, and Blondel's spiritual journals to relate his expositions to Blondel's life. He makes good use of L'Itinéraire philosophique de M. Blondel (1928), a lengthy "interview" that Blondel composed after his retirement that both serves as a philosophical apologia and an anticipation of his later work.

Part two (chapters 11-18) contains a detailed exposition of Blondel's long incubated Trilogy on Thought, Being and Action (1934-1937) and La Philosophie et l'Esprit chrétien (1944-1946) -- including archival materials for a projected third volume, left unfinished when Blondel died in 1949. Finally, Blanchette discusses the posthumously published Exigences philosophiques du christianisme (1950), which he describes as "one of Blondel's best in his later life … as a concise presentation of his philosophical approach to the study of the Christian Spirit" (800) While Blondel's early writings (1893-1913) have been made available in the first two volumes of the complete works (1995; 1997), these late writings that contain Blondel's mature philosophy and his reflections on Christian doctrine are not so readily available. Produced under difficult circumstances, they offer a better and more complete statement of Blondel's philosophy, influenced by his study of Augustine and Aquinas and by his taking into account certain criticisms of his earlier work. That Blanchette has dedicated half of his volume to their exposition is a significant contribution in itself.

The strength of the volume is its thorough exposition of Blondel's writings in chronological order, extensively summarized and often directly cited, which Blanchette illuminatingly correlates with the philosopher's life circumstances. Given Blondel's stress on "concrete" philosophy, Blanchette's attention to the moments of drama in Blondel's own life is especially appropriate. Blanchette's command of his subject allows him to make meaningful connections throughout the volume. However, the volume does not claim to be a complete biography (e.g., a complete study of Blondel's voluminous correspondence lies beyond the scope of this study), and the diachronic method of exposition necessarily results in some repetition of Blondel's basic ideas. Blanchette adheres almost exclusively to the primary sources which are correlated with a chronological index of Blondel's works at the end of the volume. While attention is also given to Blondel's contemporaneous commentators and critics, secondary studies are eschewed. Name and analytical indices complete the volume.

Blanchette highlights Blondel's Christian vocation as a philosopher. From his adolescence, Blondel had a keen awareness of the cultural crisis and intellectual malaise that was gripping his society. In spite of the preference of his parents, he chose to complete his studies in rhetoric and philosophy at the secular lycée in order "to know the state of soul of the enemies of the faith, in order to be able to have a more efficacious action on them." (102) He felt called to enter into the lists as a philosophical apologist for Christian truth that was being disparaged or dismissed by the secular intelligentsia. During his studies at the prestigious École Normale Supérieure, he conceived of a strictly philosophical project that would show the illegitimacy of the reigning "separate" philosophy, which considered the "transcendent" as utterly superfluous to self-sufficient reason's capacity to explain reality. Blondel's original philosophy of the supernatural first came to systematic expression in his controversial dissertation L'Action that was complemented by a thesis, in Latin, on the Vinculum Substantiale of Leibniz. Blondel's seminal insight was to conceive of "action" as the link between thought and being. The term "action" was not even defined in the standard philosophical dictionary of the period.

As Blanchette carefully expounds, Blondel's genius was to elaborate a meticulous phenomenology that set out the "logic of action" in human life so as to disclose its ultimate insufficiency. He grounded the progressive and ineluctable expansion of action in the dialectic of human willing that futilely seeks to equate its specific and concrete expressions with its inexhaustible, aboriginal élan. This dialectic is the expression of the ineluctable disproportion between the "willing will" (volonté voulante) and the "willed will" (volonté voulue). The "willing will" is the inexhaustible aspiration to attain the infinite that is never permanently satisfied by the "willed will," i.e., the specific, concrete instances of willing. Blondel argued that fidelity to the logic of action must lead to this "doubly imperious conclusion": "It is impossible not to recognize the insufficiency of the natural order in its totality and not to feel an ulterior need; it is impossible to find within oneself something to satisfy this religious need. It is necessary; and it is impracticable." (Action, 297) The "it" refers to the supernatural that Blondel's secular university contemporaries dismissed. Having disclosed the necessity for a supernatural completion of the natural order, Blondel's "transcendental" analysis, using a method of implication and negation, claimed to show that only the option for what he termed the "one thing necessary" could give ultimate meaning and coherence to the human project. Blanchette helpfully clarifies both the nature of this fundamental option and Blondel's critique of "superstition," Blondel's term for the idolatry of absolutizing the finite when the option for the authentically supernatural is refused.

Blondel's thesis defense was arduous. Some on his examination committee questioned its integrally philosophical character. Nevertheless, it was approved. For the sale edition, Blondel amplified Part Five in which he argued that only an option for specifically Christian revelation fulfills human action and he added a final chapter to correct the impression "that metaphysics had been left out of his phenomenology." (601) Initially denied a university professorship, he explained the properly philosophical character of his method in his 1896 "Letter on the Exigencies of Contemporary Thought in Matters of Apologetics and on the Method of Philosophy in the Study of the Religious Problem," [henceforth, "Letter"] in which his strong endorsement of the method of immanence, though not the doctrine of immanence (i.e., modern philosophy's rationalist pretension to self-sufficiency), succeeded in winning over many of his rationalist critics. Soon after, Blondel was named professor of philosophy at the University of Aix-en-Provence, about thirty miles north of Marseilles, with the additional responsibility of supervising philosophical education for the entire region. The "philosopher of Aix" remained there until his death in 1949.

Blondel's concrete philosophy of action argued for the necessary hypothesis of the supernatural over against any rationalist and immanentist claims to self-sufficiency. He repeatedly insisted that philosophy cannot trespass beyond this liminal claim, for any supernatural completion of the congenital unrest of the human spirit can only be received as pure gift; human reason is incapable of either determining its existence or of specifying its contents. Rebutting the view of a putative "natural" fulfillment to which a supernatural fulfillment, divinely revealed, is added on, Blondel defended a unitary human destiny in the concrete historical order in which human beings find themselves, a condition that he came to refer to as the "transnatural" state. Blondel repeatedly insisted that there is an essential heterogeneity, with real continuity, between the natural and supernatural orders. By re-construing the relationship between immanence and the Transcendent, without giving in to the rationalism and immanentism of modern philosophy, he sought to show "how philosophy could progress in its union with Catholic faith." (338) To his chagrin, dating from the publication of the "Letter," in which Blondel charged that the method of scholastic apologetics was philosophically sterile, his most persistent critics were certain Catholic scholastics. In response to Blondel's critique of a "static" system which "superimposes" the supernatural order on the natural order and which ignores the genuine requirements of the modern "subject," he was accused of confusing the natural and supernatural orders and wrongly impugning the value of the concept. These early controversies typify the two fronts on which Blondel was to defend his philosophy of the supernatural throughout his career, namely, against various forms of rationalism, on the one hand, and against supernatural extrinsicism, on the other.

Blondel revisited the gravamen of the relationship between the natural and supernatural orders in various essays provoked by "mixed" questions (e.g., his articles entitled "History and Dogma" that responded to Loisy's historicism and his "Testis" series that defended the social Catholics). This sidetracked Blondel from completing a major work on apologetics until late in life. During the pontificate of Pius X, he was sorely grieved by the Modernist crisis. While none of his works were condemned, his apologetics of immanence was targeted by the anti-modernist encyclical Pascendi (1907). While Blondel agreed with the Church's condemnation of what he termed "efferent" immanentism, it did so from the vantage point of a one-sided extrinsicist "afference" that Blondel dubbed "monophorism" in his "Testis" series (1909-10). He argued for a "double afference" that recognizes both the "external fact" of the revealed Supernatural and the "internal fact" of hidden grace at work in the depths of the human spirit. He also incisively criticized the "monophorist" alliance between Catholics and the politico-cultural movement of Action Française. Hans Urs von Balthasar called the "Testis" articles the best analysis of the integralist mentality.

Among the gems in Blanchette's volume is the chapter entitled "The Question of a Catholic Philosophy," in which he reviews the last major controversy in which Blondel participated that concerned the legitimacy of "Christian" philosophy. To mark the fifteenth centenary of Augustine's death, Blondel contributed to two different collections of essays on Augustine, whom Blondel defended as the "father of Christian philosophy." Pace Étienne Gilson who had touted the properly scientific character of Thomism in comparison with Augustine, Blondel argued for the philosophical validity of Augustine's method which "stimulat[es] a science of the interior dynamism." Indeed, Blondel's own philosophy of action could be viewed as a rigorous phenomenology of Augustine's "cor inquietum." Blanchette remarks: "One gets the impression that Blondel was perhaps thinking of his own philosophy as part of this complementary renovation for Thomism, even though it was not directly tributary to Augustine." (365)

In the next round, two eminent historians of philosophy, Émile Bréhier and Gilson, published on "Christian" philosophy, the former denying its validity in any sense and the latter acknowledging it in a limited historical sense. Blondel then defended the validity and the necessity of "Catholic" philosophy, which eschews both a "separate" philosophy and any artificial "concordism" that effectively naturalizes Christian revelation. This controversy of the early 1930s has resonances with the disputes that had engaged Blondel early in his career. In November 1933, the question was debated at a meeting of the Thomist Society, attended by many eminent European thinkers. A strong consensus opposed Blondel's position. Ferdinand van Steenberghen set out a mediating position that viewed Blondel's work as a philosophy of Christianity, but this was rejected by Blondel. This dispute is worth revisiting and, mirabile dictu, Catholic University Press will soon publish Reason Fulfilled by Revelation (ed. Greg Sadler) containing relevant translations and a commentary.

Blondel often felt misunderstood and even calumniated. Though unauthorized copies of the original L'Action won him many admirers (Norris Clarke, S.J., recalled secretly reading a copy at night by flashlight!), Blondel refused to allow its re-publication because he wanted to elaborate a comprehensive philosophy of being, thinking, and action that would also respond to certain misinterpretations that dogged him. This long deferred program was finally realized with the publication of the Trilogy in the 1930s.

Though Blondel was criticized throughout his career by certain Scholastics, such as Réginald Garrigou-Lagrange, he found support in the Thomistic renewal that retrieved St. Thomas's teaching on the "natural desire for the supernatural" as well as the true "intellectualism" of the Doctor Communis. (301) Blondel realized he had mistakenly identified authentic Thomism with the distortions he had read in neo-scholastic manuals. This led to certain retractiones and modifications in his later work. The primary neuralgic issue was his understanding of the relationship between the natural and supernatural orders and how to characterize the appetite for the supernatural that exists in the soul. His Scholastic critics contended that Blondel's claim to establish a "necessity" for the supernatural compromised its gratuity and confused the two orders. Hippolyte Ligeard, a scholastic theologian who was sympathetic to Blondel's philosophy of action, reproached any attempt to harmonize the requirements of nature and the Catholic faith so that Catholicism alone would respond to the requirements of nature. Blondel accepted his former student and dear friend Auguste Valensin's interpretation of his thought that "it is only a question of discovering in ourselves the obediential potency, the supernaturally-stimulated appetite" for the supernatural.

Blanchette indicates that Blondel is "more subdued" in his later work in treating the hypothesis of a supernatural gift to complement the gift of nature itself, not insisting as much on its "necessity" as he had in his dissertation, but presenting it "as a truly rational possibility." (649) For example, in Action II (published in 1937), he omitted "any prolonged discussion of the shape such a supernatural gift would have to take as revelation and as call to a higher level of responsibility in human action, such as was found in Action of 1893." (597) In Exigences philosophiques du christianisme Blondel avoided the assertion of a true exigence for the supernatural in favor "of a rational expectation and a marvelous convenience or convenance, for satisfying our most fundamental spiritual élan, all of which takes nothing away from the possibility of a natural order that could subsist, without the supernatural, in some viable but imperfect equilibrium of nature." (801) Thus some commentators distinguish between the early and the later Blondel. Yet Blanchette maintains that "there is no evidence in all of Blondel's work" for "a radical switch in his thinking." (599)

Blondel's influence on twentieth-century Catholic theology requires further study. Blanchette mentions Blondel's influence on "Catholic existential theologians like Karl Rahner and Henri de Lubac, which shows that Blondel's confidence in his progressive Catholic ideas was not misplaced, especially not after John XXIII and the Second Vatican Council." (232) But Blondel was not always well served by his "more theologically inclined interpreters … (Bouillard, de Lubac, Saint Jean)" (143) The Blondelian legacy, especially its impact on the understanding of the natural-supernatural relationship, is pertinent to contemporary theological debates.

In a work of this size, there are inevitably a few corrigenda, but very few indeed. On p. 58, what was condemned in 1910 was not a "journal" but the movement of Le Sillon. On p. 130, Pope Leo's pontificate (1878-1903) is given as commencing in 1893. On p. 243, Bernard Gaudeau's journal La Foi catholique is identified as an article. On p. 330, a "not" seems to have been omitted in the phrase "does suffice to grasp" with reference to the relationship between "abstract and discursive understanding" and "being"; so too on p. 335 in the phrase "it does come to completion only by itself."

Blanchette refers to Blondel's boyhood fascination with insects. It also should be mentioned that Blondel had made a special "ex-libris" plate with the image of a grasshopper. Reflecting his childhood fascination with nature, this insect became emblematic for Blondel of the élan of the human spirit "that means letting go of one's egoism and entrusting oneself to the forces of the universe, gambling on them and speculating on what they will do, almost like a grasshopper leaping with abandonment, without seeing where it will land." (625)

In sum, Oliva Blanchette has made a monumental contribution, just in time to celebrate the sesquicentennial anniversary of Blondel's birth (1861).