Maximal God: A New Defense of Perfect Being Theism

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Yujin Nagasawa, Maximal God: A New Defense of Perfect Being Theism, Oxford University Press, 2017, 225pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198758686.

Reviewed by Jonathan L. Kvanvig, Washington University in St. Louis


It is a rare thing to find a book that is accessible in spite of being on a topic that has become a home of increasingly technical detail. We find such a rare gem here. It is a defense of perfect being theism, the claim that there is a greatest metaphysically possible being. Some will find such accessibility refreshing, though those who wanted to see an improved version of the ontological argument, for example, will be disappointed. What we get instead is touted as a new, original, improved way of responding to objections to perfect being theism as well as a new and improved way of defending the possibility of God's existence, a claim central to the prospects for the ontological argument.

Part I engages with the history of perfect being theology and its connection to the idea of a great chain of being. Nagasawa argues that perfect being theology has widespread endorsement in both Greco-Roman thinking as well as in Christian sources, both obvious (Anselm) and non-obvious (various parts of the Bible). Part II is devoted to objections to perfect being theism, usefully categorized in terms of those that find some great-making property inconsistent, those that find conflict between great-making properties, and those that find conflict between maximal greatness and contingent facts, especially evil and the hiddenness of God. Part III is devoted to responding to criticisms of the ontological argument, the existential basis for perfect being theism. Here, Nagasawa limits the scope by focusing on criticisms that don't have to make significant and controversial metaphysical and epistemological claims in order to undermine the argument. The result is a predominant concern with parody objections such as Gaunilo's perfect island argument. The last substantive chapter examines modal versions of the ontological argument and various attempts to defend its central claim that the existence of a maximally perfect being is possible.

The new and improved approach plays a central role both in this last chapter and in giving a way to respond to objections to the possibility of a perfect being arising from concerns about the consistency of and between various great-making properties. The strategy here is to avoid, according to Nagasawa, building the concept of God out of atoms of great-making properties, and instead starting with the idea of God being the greatest possible being. On this top-down, holistic approach, one then derives the most impressive consistent combination of great-making properties, identifying this collection with maximal perfection. If this strategy works, there is no need to defend perfect being theism from objections charging inconsistencies internal to, or between, individual divine attributes. Moreover, if the combination of individual features composing maximal greatness is consistent, combining it with the ontological argument provides a formidable defense of perfect being theism.

Too good to be true, you ask? In part, yes. The part that shows more promise is the part where the holism relieves pressure from attacks on atoms and their combinations. If you think omniscience is incoherent, no problem: the holism then only requires that God be as knowledgeable as is compatible with all other individual great-making properties. If you think omnipotence conflicts with omnibenevolence, no problem either: just withdraw from the lofty peaks a bit, so that God is very powerful and very good.

This idea shows some promise, but the top-down approach faces several central difficulties. First, it needs a defense of the claim that there is a unique combination of great-making properties that secures reference for the phrase 'the greatest possible being.' If the only properties involved in being the greatest possible being were omni-properties involving knowledge, power, and goodness, there is no problem here. But if there is a problem, either individually or jointly, in omni-properties, then we need an explanation of how and why there is a unique weakening of some that is logically consistent. Here I'll only record my prior probability: I expect there to be no unique such weakening, but rather a host of different weakenings, yielding equal amounts of greatness.

One might think of dropping the uniqueness requirement, but it isn't clear that the result would be coherent. For suppose we have eight different combinations, all of which are consistent and generate the same overall amount of greatness. Then, if the ontological argument goes through, we have eight deities, with nothing in the story to guarantee coherence. Perhaps multiple deities are possible if they all agree in intention, purpose, desire, etc.; but it isn't clear that being agreeable in this way is a great-making property rather than a nice convenience to avoid the drama of a Greek pantheon. In any case, polytheism threatens in a way not assuaged by claiming without argument that there is a unique weakening.

The second major difficulty facing the top-down approach arises in the context of the ontological argument. Nagasawa first engages the discussion in the standard way: we have an argument where the controversy concerns the possibility claim, that a maximally perfect being is possible. Here Nagasawa touts the virtues of the top-down approach again, claiming that such an approach guarantees the consistency of the idea of a maximally perfect being, and thereby guarantees the metaphysical possibility needed:

We can automatically derive that it is possible that God exists because here God is understood as the being that has the maximal consistent set of knowledge, power, and benevolence. In other words, the maximal concept of God is by definition internally coherent because its components are mutually consistent (and internally coherent). This guarantees the possibility of the existence of God. (p. 204)

There are two problems with this maneuver, however. The first is the rather astonishing claim that consistency guarantees possibility. It doesn't. That's the lesson revealed by a posteriori necessities, claims that have denials that are logically consistent. One might try to restrict the inference to the a priori realm alone, but that doesn't help: lots of a priori philosophical theses are necessarily true if true at all, but remain subjects of substantive dispute precisely because both the thesis and its negation are logically consistent. Perhaps the inconsistency is such a deep one that we haven't seen it yet, but that's a hope rather than an argument. Moreover, since the converse of this inference is trustworthy (logical consistency follows from metaphysical possibility), endorsing this inference gives us an equivalence between consistency and possibility that arguably flouts Gödel's second incompleteness theorem.[1]

The other problem with this defense of the ontological argument threatens to undermine the advantages provided by a top-down approach. For recall that the ontological argument depends on a further great-making property the possession of which can generate an inference from possible existence to necessary existence. Nagasawa relies on the version of the argument found in Alvin Plantinga's The Nature of Necessity, but central to Plantinga's approach is a bottom-up strategy, first identifying great-making properties that have intrinsic maxima and then deriving that God is an omni-being. Then, existence itself, or something involving it, is also taken to be great-making, with necessary existence being the maximum value possible. (My preferred way of expressing this idea is to talk about possible beings that have maximally fragile existence, where any change to a world in which they exist results in a world where they don't exist; then define durability as the capacity to continue to exist despite changes, with maximal durability implying necessary existence.) So, God is not only an omni-being, but also necessarily existent if possible.

Note, however, that this derivation of the property of being necessary if possible is bottom-up. Moreover, it is unavailable to a top-down strategy, in the same way that being an omni-being doesn't follow from being maximally perfect on the top-down strategy. So, from a top-down perspective, one is only entitled to add the durability of existence to the properties of being knowledgeable, powerful, and good, and then see what combinations of these great-making properties generate maximum overall value. Such a maximal value might involve omniscience and it might not; it might involve omnipotence but perhaps not; it might involve omnibenevolence but there is no guarantee of it; and it might involve maximal durability of existence but perhaps not. From a top-down perspective, all bets are off.

Note again that the more standard bottom-up approach to maximal perfection doesn't face this problem. On a bottom-up approach, one looks for great-making properties with intrinsic maxima, thereby deriving (if all goes well for perfect being theism) omniscience, omnipotence, and omnibenevolence. Moreover, one can also derive necessary existence by the same pattern of reasoning, for if durable existence is great-making, then necessary existence is the maximum in question. So, on a bottom-up approach, we rule out being not necessary if possible in the same way we rule out knowing a lot but not everything. The cost of such a bottom-up approach, as Nagasawa notes, is that we don't get the metaphysical possibility of the set of all these great-making properties for free. That point is well-taken, and what the argument of the last paragraph shows is that the top-down approach must face its own version of that same problem.

I thus see major obstacles here to the success of the project, but even so, the book is a sizeable accomplishment. It develops a new approach to an old tradition in philosophical theology. It provides a nice compendium of endorsements of perfect being theology, is thoroughly versed in the literature, and gives probative responses to every position the author rejects. The book is thus admirable along many dimensions. It would be a useful read for anyone in philosophy or theology, and required reading for anyone working in philosophical theology.


Thanks to Kenny Boyce, Alex Pruss, and students in my Spring 2018 graduate seminar (Graham Renz, Chris Collacchia, T-Herbert Jeffrey, Alec Michael, and Gennaro Olivo (a group a greater than which is hard to conceive)) for helpful discussion.


Chalmers, David. 2006. "Two-Dimensional Semantics." In Oxford Handbook of the Philosophy of Language. Oxford.

Pruss, Alexander R. 2015. "Possibility is Not Consistency." Philosophical Studies 172 (9): 2341 -- 2348.

[1] For explanation and defense, see Pruss (2015).