McTaggart's Paradox

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R. D. Ingthorsson, McTaggart's Paradox, Routledge, 2016, 154pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138677241.

Reviewed by M. Joshua Mozersky, Queen's University, Kingston


J. M. E. McTaggart is well known for distinguishing two ways of conceptualizing time: first, as a series of positions ordered by 'past', 'present', and 'future', which he calls the A-series; secondly, as a series of positions ordered by 'earlier than', 'later than', and 'simultaneous with', which he calls the B-series. He argues that the A-series is both essential to time and contradictory, so time cannot exist. This argument holds an interesting place in the philosophical catalogue, as it is treated with the utmost respect and seriousness by some (e.g. Michael Dummett, Paul Horwich, D. H. Mellor) but dismissed as sophomoric by others (e.g. C.D Broad, Theodore Sider, Dean Zimmerman). Perhaps more interestingly, pretty much every philosophy of time is described as either an 'A-theory', a 'B-theory', or some combination thereof. His terminology remains ubiquitous.

In this book, R. D. Ingthorsson takes us on a thoughtful, well-researched, and enlightening journey through McTaggart's views on the nature of time, arguing that they can only be properly understood in relation to his wider metaphysical system. In particular, Ingthorsson argues that the huge secondary literature spawned by McTaggart's argument has fallen into stalemate because his views continue to be misunderstood (p. 2); accordingly, a systematic treatment promises philosophical progress (p. 5).

Ingthorsson begins with an overview of McTaggart's metaphysics, focusing on two key points. First, that everything real or existent -- McTaggart insists on the co-extensiveness of the two terms -- must be a substance, quality, or relation. Substances are ontologically primary as qualities and relations depend on them for their existence (p. 17). One might infer that McTaggart believed that substances can exist independently of qualities and relations, but Ingthorsson points out that for McTaggart, 'substances are individuated by their characteristics (i.e. qualities and relations)' (p. 17). So, it seems that without qualities and relations, there could be no individuated substances after all (logically, there could still be non-individuated 'stuff', though such a category makes no appearance here). For McTaggart, time must be some combination of substance, quality, or relation.

The second important aspect of McTaggart's metaphysics is that he considers reality to be absolute, i.e. a 'perfect and completed whole' (p. 9). Accordingly, he assumes that past, present, and future are equally real: reality must include them all (p. 22), for that is the most complete possibility. Today, this ontological position is known as eternalism.

One can detect a tension starting to surface. Temporality involves change, impermanence, flux, etc. Reality, on the other hand, is completed and perfect. How can the former be instantiated in the latter?

Now consider that one thing that A-series properties must do is change: something that is future will eventually be present, then past. How are we to make sense of this? As Ingthorsson points out (pp. 43-45), McTaggart takes the A-series to consist of relations between events and something else. This something else cannot, however, be within the time series, for then A-relations would never change: if x is past relative to T, then x is always past relative to T. So, the relations must hold between events and something outside of time (pp. 45-49).

All of this leads to difficulty:

Since an A series, as described by McTaggart, does not merely consist of a given sequence of events, N, M , O, P . . . that each exist in one or other of the relations 'past', 'present', 'future' to that something outside of time . . . but also consists in each event existing equally in innumerable infinity of incompatible tensed relations, then contradiction is guaranteed when we try to construe a descriptive model that satisfies both the requirements of what an Absolute Reality must be like and what a Temporal Reality must be like. (p. 69)

Notice, however, that contradiction results only if it is assumed that an event must stand in tense relations to one and the same entity. As I stand before a classroom, I cannot be on John's left and right with respect to position P; but I can be on his left with respect to P and his right with respect to Q. So, either spatial relations are contradictory, or they vary with respect to distinct reference points. The latter is the obvious solution, so why not do the same with tense?

If we adopt this line of response, then there is no need to relate events to something outside of time to render A-series relations coherent; we can relate them to different positions within time: for M to be present and to have been future is for M to stand in the being present relation to T2 and the being future relation to T1. No contradiction lurks.

What does lurk, however, is the problem of change. Is there any change captured in this model? McTaggart thinks not, for what remains is a series of events all standing in various relations to each other, the whole collection of which never changes. In other words, what we have is a B-series. But this is simply a mistake, for a completed totality that never changes is not truly temporal, as time can exist only if there is genuine change. In other words, without the A-series, there can be no B-series (pp. 35-42).

So, the question becomes whether a completed totality can include genuine change: if so, then the simplest approach is to adopt a theory in which time is no more than a B-series; if not, then we must defend some temporal ontology that McTaggart doesn't consider (or else reject the essential connection between time and change, a strategy I won't pursue further, though I consider it viable).

Ingthorsson thinks that the B-series cannot accommodate change because only perdurantism is compatible with eternalism:

any object that exists over a period of time must be divided into substantial parts, each of which exists at different times and has at those times different properties. (p. 80)

Change then becomes a matter of variation between parts, which isn't really change at all since nothing gains or loses a property. This could be avoided if an alternative to perdurantism were available, but Ingthorsson is sceptical, arguing that if we reject perdurance we must accept endurance, in which objects are wholly present at different times; but this runs up against the eternalist ontology: how can x be wholly at both T1 and T2 unless it is in fact two objects? Recall, both states of affairs are equally real on the B-series. So:

there exists no good answer to McTaggart's argument against the B-series . . . the incompatibility of the endurance view of persistence and the B view of time is an unavoidable consequence of the fact that endurantism is incompatible with the principle of temporal parity [i.e. eternalism]. (p. 111)

Ingthorsson concludes that the only path to securing the reality of time passes through the rejection of eternalism. Since an existent past would inherit the paradoxical aspects of B-series endurance, Ingthorsson opts for presentism, the view in which reality is restricted to the present.

This leaves two key questions. First, is there really no way to combine endurance with eternalism? In my view, Ingthorsson attaches too much weight, in his rejection of endurantism, to the concept wholly present. I can't hold this against him too strongly, as it is the term of art in the contemporary debate. However, to my eyes, it is an awkward phrase that is hard to interpret, especially with regard to time. As I type these words, on November 30, 2016, I am in Kingston, Ontario. If I were at roll call, and heard my name, I might very well reply 'present'; I would not say 'wholly present'. So, am I wholly present in Kingston right now, or merely present, and what is the difference? Well, one way of explicating the difference would be by employing temporal parts: I am merely present if just a temporal part of me is in Kingston on November 30, 2016; wholly present otherwise.

Very well then; all we need for B-theoretic endurance is the denial of temporal parts: if I am not composed of such things, and I am in Kingston on November 30, 2016, then I am wholly present then. Does this view avoid the paradox of change: can we also suppose that I am in Kingston, but not typing, on December 1, 2016, without either falling into contradiction or else assuming I am in fact two wholly present beings? If typing is a relation, which I stand in to one time but not the other, then the answer is yes: it is no contradiction to suppose I stand in the typing relation to one time but not another, and since I am one person in both cases, identity is preserved through this change.

Understood this way, I have no objection to the idea of whole presence, but I suggest we drop the term simply because it suggests that to be at place P at time T is to have all one's parts there then; but this is either the trivial claim that all one's parts that exist at T are at P then, or else the obviously false one that all the parts one has ever had, or will have, are at P at T. 'Presence' will do instead.

The upshot is that the endurantist-eternalist should insist that existing at is a one-many relation. An object, x, can stand in this relation to more than one time (and place, of course). Ingthorsson, however, objects that on this view:

the location of the object in time is utterly unclear; is it every-when, or only here now, or something in between? (p. 111)

I think the answer is that the object has no single temporal location but, rather, is tenselessly located at all the times encompassing its existence. It is, to my ears, strange to ask for the temporal location of an object, i.e. when it is. What, for example, is Winston Churchill's temporal location: when is he? I am not sure what is being asked, but I do know that he was born November 30, 1874 and died January 24, 1965, so I am willing to say that he exists, tenselessly, at every moment between those two dates. That, if we care to speak this way, is 'when' he is, and this can be understood in terms of a one-many relation between him and various moments of time.

I doubt Ingthorsson would agree:

The very idea of an enduring particular . . . is of a three-dimensional thing that exists wholly and exclusively at one time at a time, i.e. it is not multiply located in time any more than a football that crosses the pitch is multiply located at all points of its spatial trajectory [original emphasis]. (p. 102)

I disagree. First, this defines endurance in such a way as to render it paradoxical if more than one time exists; but why should we accept that endurance entails exclusive existence at each time, if this means rejecting the one-many nature of the being at relation? I simply don't see the motivation. Secondly, I think that a football that crosses a pitch is located at all the points of its trajectory; it isn't, of course, at each point at once, but it is at each point at some time or other. The endurantist can insist upon something similar with respect to position in time: an object is at each point of time in its lifespan at a given time (the same times in every case).

Now to the second important question: is presentism a viable ontology? The main worry here is the grounding objection that what exists in the present is compatible with many past and future histories so, if presentism is accepted, we must reject determinate facts concerning the past and future: the way things are now underdetermines the way things were or will be, so there is no fact of the matter as to how things have gone and will go.

Ingthorsson rejects most presentist responses to the grounding objection (pp. 128-136) but considers two alternatives. The first is to bite the bullet:

Given that there is no future or past, is it really a problem that therefore there are no truths about the future and/or past? (p. 136).

The rejection of past and future truth isn't so bad, argues Ingthorsson, because beliefs about the non-present can nevertheless be warranted by currently existing evidence such as written records, photographs, memories, and widely accepted theories (p. 137). I, however, am not drawn to the combination of supposing one's beliefs about the non-present to be both justified and not true. For example, I take the fossil record to justify my belief that there were dinosaurs, but if I accept presentism I must also acknowledge that it is not true that there were dinosaurs. Doesn't the latter simply undercut the former? Why isn't this tantamount to claiming that the evidence is always misleading?

The second alternative is to suppose that:

Material reality is made of a permanent portion of some substratum that does not come into being or go out of being but is only converted from one form to another . . . to exist is to be either the whole or a portion of this material substance, or an instantiated qualitative state of it, or a relation between existent matter or the qualities instantiated in it. (pp. 138-9)

This is an interesting suggestion, but with a familiar worry: what, on such a view, makes it the case that the substratum is permanent, i.e. did exist and will exist? It would seem that its current state fails to ground such facts. Perhaps the idea is to bite the bullet, as in the first response, but then I am left with my earlier unease.

Though I have expressed a number of reservations concerning Ingthorsson's conclusions with respect to endurance and presentism, I remain extremely enthusiastic about the book as a whole, which is truly an excellent piece of both philosophy and scholarship: argumentative and rigorous, informative and thought provoking. It is also superbly written, exhibiting exceptional clarity, concision, and flow. It is in all respects a first rate contribution. Anybody interested in McTaggart, the philosophy of time, or metaphysics will reap tremendous rewards from engaging with Ingthorsson's ideas; do give them a go.


Broad, C. D., 1938, Examination of McTaggart's Philosophy, Vol. II (Cambridge University Press).

Dummett, Michael, 1960, 'A Defence of McTaggart's Proof of the Unreality of Time', Philosophical Review 69: 497-504.

Horwich, Paul, 1987, Asymmetries in Time (MIT Press).

Mellor, D. H., 1998, Real Time II (Routledge).

Sider, Theodore, 2001, Four-Dimensionalism: An Ontology of Persistence and Time (Oxford University Press). Zimmerman, Dean, 2005, 'The A-Theory of Time, The B-Theory of Time, and "Taking Tense Seriously"', Dialectica 59: 401-57