Me, You, Us: Essays

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George Sher, Me, You, Us: Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 216pp., $74.00, ISBN 9780190660413.

Reviewed by Evan Tiffany, Simon Fraser University


I first met George Sher in the summer of 2000 at the Social Philosophy and Policy workshop in La Jolla, California, where he was presenting "But I Could Be Wrong," the penultimate essay in this collection. I became an instant fan. I was just a graduate student at the time, but I remember finding it inspirational to witness a prominent member of the profession taking seriously the possibility that our own moral judgments are no more likely to be true or justified than are those of any number of others. To my mind, Sher had identified a problem that was not just academically but existentially significant. As I reread and reflect on that essay, it strikes me that its spirit of humility and skepticism embodies the essays in this collection, many of which reflect a Socratic commitment to questioning commonly-held convictions and philosophic dogma. But unlike the Socrates of the Platonic dialogues, Sher often ends up defending common sense; thus, to the extent that he is a philosophic gadfly he at least follows his biting criticism with a soothing balm. Even when subjecting his fellow philosophers to trenchant criticism, Sher writes with a degree of charity and caution that is all-too-often lacking in our profession.

The eleven essays in this collection  (three previously unpublished) cover a vast swath of territory including normative ethics, metaethics, political philosophy, moral responsibility, meta-philosophy, and even a light-hearted contribution to professional ethics. Although diverse, the essays are unified in their embrace of an "older, starker" form of individualism that emphasizes the distinctness of persons, in contrast to the increasing tendency to analyse central moral concepts in terms of collectives and relations. Because I cannot say something of substance about such a wide range of topics, I shall focus on those about which I am most familiar: practical reason and moral responsibility. But I do at least want to say a few words about the three new essays.

In "What is Moral Standing?" Sher takes up the question of moral status and how we can reconcile the common-sense view that all humans have equal standing but that we are sometimes permitted to treat people unequally. Sher's interesting and plausible suggestion is that we think of moral theories as functions from inputs to outputs where the interests of persons feature both as inputs and as outputs. By treating each person's interests as having equal weight qua input, we can capture the ideal of moral equality. But this is consistent with recognizing that "the argument that takes us from these claims about interests to principles about how individuals or governments may or must act toward the entities in question" (p. 54) may generate principles that permit people to prioritize the interests of certain persons over those of others.

In "How Bad Is It to Be Dominated?" Sher takes on the democratic egalitarian view that preserving relations of non-domination is the fundamental aim of political justice. While this debate is outside my area of expertise, I found myself thoroughly convinced by Sher's central point that "the relations of domination and submission are just too peripheral, both to most people's deepest concerns and to the most important functions of government, to allow us to count their elimination as the state's most fundamental aim," that we care far more about things such as

having to endure an untreated cancer, never being able to find a job, helplessly watching one's children drift into crime, having to spend one's last years homeless or living on dog food, contracting an incurable disease that has been allowed to become pandemic, or getting caught up in a war. (p. 93)

As I write this review, the United States is undergoing a humanitarian crisis whereby migrant children are being separated from their parents at the direction of the Trump Administration. While a relation of dominance allows this to take place, the fundamental injustice is surely the inhumanity of ripping children from their mothers. I suspect that Sher is correct that if you were to inform previous refugees that the Department of Justice could have taken their children, but chose not to, this "would be roughly like learning that an undetected comet had narrowly missed the earth a few months ago" (p. 97). It is a jarring thought, but so long as the threat of concrete harm has passed, power asymmetries per se return to the periphery of things that keep one up at night.

The first essay in the collection, "We're Number One" (also new), questions the conventional wisdom that we take others' interests as carrying some weight in our deliberations, but not as much as our own interests. Sher considers but ultimately rejects the worry that this is merely "an unprincipled compromise between two powerful but irreconcilable intellectual pressures" (p. 12). In defending the common-sense view, Sher takes his fundamental argumentative burden to be that of showing that the personal and the impersonal generate two distinct classes of reasons. As someone attracted to normative pluralism, I am inclined to agree with Sher. However, I would argue that he fails to discharge the equally important burden of showing that the reasons which are generated by these distinct normative standpoints are commensurable; he must tell us what normative perspective determines the relative weight of the two kinds of reasons. If it is either of the two particular sources of reasons, then Sher owes an explanation for how a normative standpoint can assign weight to a fact that it does not even recognize as a reason. If, on the other hand, the weighing is done from some supreme standpoint of "Reason-as-such," then he owes an explanation for why that isn't the single source of reasons.

In what I found to be the most interesting part of the essay, Sher argues that even if all reasons are grounded in the first-personal perspective, it is possible to defend a variant of the dual-source view. If right, this would address the problem of commensurability, for one and the same standpoint could account for both the source and weight of reasons. On Sher's analysis, the first-personal analogue of a dual-source view begins from the claim that we have a reason to promote some interest of our own, and then locates two general features of our situation that could generate such a reason:

That it is an interest of mine.
That it is an interest of a person.

Sher then argues that because we want to be guided by reasons, "to establish that a given agent has a stable desire to advance everyone's interests, it would be sufficient to establish that he reliably understands the reason-giving aspect of his situation in the second way" (p. 29). Moreover, the fact that we have more reason to act on our own interests can be accounted for by the fact that "most of us take our own interests to provide us with reasons . . . both because they are our own and because they are the interests of a person with whom we happen to be identical" (p. 29).

This strikes me as overly intellectualized in a way that is similar to Sher's objection to democratic egalitarianism: the ultimate normative grounds of our reasons is just too peripheral to people's deepest concerns to ground a stable desire. People care about their friends and family, their careers, their projects; they have various desires and whims; and most also generally want to do the right thing. People care whether their actions will benefit the people they care about, contribute to their projects, satisfy their desires, or thwart long-term ambitions. But they generally do not care about what grounds the "reason-giving force" of those interests; a fortiori, they do not care whether, e.g., their love for their child provides a reason because it is the interest of a person with whom one happens to be identical. It is not even clear to me the common-sense view is commonly held, unless it is interpreted as an general empirical claim. But so understood, it can be explained by the simple fact that people generally do care about the well-being of others, just not as much as they care about their own or their loved-ones' well-being.

It is Sher's work on moral responsibility that I am most familiar with, having been a particular fan of Who Knew? In "Responsibility, Conversation, and Communication," Sher takes on the central thesis of Michael McKenna's Responsibility and Communication: that being responsible and holding responsible are metaphysically interdependent. Specifically, Sher presses on the claim that in order for S to qualify as responsible for A-ing at some time t1, S must not only understand the wrongness of A-ing at t1, but also how it would be appropriate for others to react at time t2 to such wrongdoing, and how it would be appropriate for S to respond to these reactions at t3. I will not attempt to convey the nuance and complexity of Sher's criticism, but shall offer two potential responses on behalf of McKenna, only one of which McKenna might be willing to accept.

The first potential response is to focus on a person's degree of blameworthiness. Suppose that Bloggs does something wrong, and knows that it is wrong, but (incorrectly) believes it was only a minor infraction. When Viggo reacts with seething resentment, Bloggs is genuinely confused, and responds, "Why are you making such a big deal out this?" It does not strike me as implausible to think that understanding the nature of one's wrongdoing includes understanding the gravity of the wrongdoing, and that understanding the kinds of responses that would be appropriate is partly constitutive of understanding the gravity of the act. I suspect that Sher would still resist this move and hold that it is at least possible to have a purely cognitive appreciation of the act's wrongness, for example, in terms of rating it on a scale from 1 to 10. But my intuitions are at least more conflicted when I think about the relation between the turpitude of some wrongdoing and what would count as an appropriate response. After all, when it comes to the law, the seriousness of an offense does seem to be intimately bound up with the level of punishment associated with it. If one believes that an offense only warrants a small fine, when in fact it warrants multiple years in jail, then arguably one has failed to fully appreciate the gravity of one's crime.

A perhaps more promising response -- but one that McKenna would not accept -- involves an appeal to the scholastic influence of Darwall's theory of obligation. McKenna draws on Darwall's view of second-personal accountability to motivate the view that: "The practices by which others hold one morally responsible are themselves expressions of demands that as a competent agent one must be able to grasp and treat as reasons that apply to one" (McKenna, 2012, p. 84; cited in Sher, p. 154). But I think it is important to recognize how, for Darwall, the appeal to demands is rooted in the natural law distinction between counsel and command, where these are qualitatively distinct types of normative force. There may be many good reasons to do something, but there is a difference between simply having most reason to do it and being obligated to do it. When your physician tells you to exercise, she is simply offering counsel. If you choose not to follow that advice, you may be foolish, but you are not blameworthy. In contrast, if your drill sergeant orders you to exercise, you are accountable for non-compliance. Like the natural lawyers, Darwall conceives of obligation as conceptually tied to accountability-to-demands because the latter is what characterizes the distinctive normative force exerted by obligation. Now, if moral obligation is conceptually connected to second-personal demand, which in turn is grounded in relations of mutual accountability, then it does not seem implausible to think that I cannot fully grasp the nature of an obligation unless I also grasp the ways in which I can be held accountable by those I've wronged by violating their legitimate moral demands.

The problem is that McKenna intends his account of blame to have a wide scope, applying not just to violations of obligations but to cases of "suberogation" and other forms of aretaic evaluation. Indeed, in a response to other critics, McKenna warns against "treating the link between blameworthiness and wrongdoing as a definitional or analytic matter" due to our tendency to "feast exclusively on a diet of cases involving violations of obligations" (2014, p. 83). But for Darwall, the conceptual tie between obligation and accountability is due not to an impoverished diet of examples, but to the distinctive normative force of obligation. Now, Sher would likely reject this theory of obligation; he would likely view third-personal reasons as capable of generating obligations. But he need not be saddled with the argumentative burden of arguing against Darwall's theory of obligation. Rather, he could simply reframe the original challenge in the form of a dilemma: to the extent that McKenna insists on a broad scope for his view, the expansive conception of the knowledge condition becomes less plausible (for the reasons Sher articulates).

When it comes to responsibility for moral ignorance, Sher takes the very reasonable middle position that people are sometimes, but not always (or even usually), excused for actions performed from moral ignorance. While "Blame and Moral Ignorance" is mostly a response to the "always-blameworthy challenge" that Sher takes to be implicit in Nomy Arpaly's Unprincipled Virtue, Sher also gestures toward a positive view. I agree with Sher's criticisms of Arpaly's view, but wish to register some concerns with the positive view he advances. I agree with the letter of Sher's claim that "a morally ignorant wrongdoer is only culpable if he could reasonably have been expected to recognize the falsity of his guiding moral beliefs" (p. 175). However, in unpacking what counts as a "reasonable expectation," I worry that Sher focuses exclusively on what we might call the objective balance of reasons (i.e. how an ideal deliberator would balance the objective weights of all and only the relevant correct reasons for action). His main example of what would count as excusable ignorance involves debates between higher-level theories such as Kantianian versus utilitarianism -- it would be unreasonable to expect the Kantian or utilitarian to recognize the falsity of their view because there are objectively good reasons on both sides.

As an example of culpable ignorance, Sher considers a person who was indoctrinated from childhood into a set of religious beliefs and doctrines that permit (even require) morally abhorrent acts of cruelty. According to Sher, such a person is likely culpable because they "have access to reasons for rejecting [the doctrine's] abhorrent implications," specifically, the (objectively very weighty) reason that "when a religious doctrine that is put forth as revealed is said to require wanton cruelty . . . there is -- to put it mildly -- reason to be skeptical about that doctrine" (p. 174). Sher recognizes that not everyone in the society will recognize these reasons. But he maintains that:

Although it convincingly illustrates the ease with which a combination of social pressure, personal advantage, intellectual laziness, fear, and simple inertia can cause a person not to think and act as he should, it goes little distance toward undermining the claim that each member of such a society knows enough to know better . . . I am inclined to believe that simply being born into a morally corrupt culture does not get a wrongdoer off the hook. (p. 174)

This last sentence is uncharacteristically uncharitable of Sher, for the excusing condition is not the mere fact of having been born into a corrupt society; rather, it has to do with the kinds of influences to which members of that culture are subject, including some of those he mentions: immense social pressure, fear, and inertia. Each of these things are scalar, and one might be skeptical that they add up to grounds for full excuse. But it is one thing to note that, objectively speaking, there are reasons that are "available" to a person, and another to expect people to recognize these reasons and accord them their proper weight when they have been subjected, from birth, to coercive societal and familial pressure aimed at denying and distorting those reasons, while shining the "spotlight" on opposing reasons. This is especially so to the extent that the particular methods of indoctrination have the effect of inhibiting the proper development of empathy, which many take to be a crucial capacity underlying our ability to appreciate certain types of moral reasons.

In closing, I note that the final essay, "Global Norming," is one of the funniest things I have read of late. I read this on the airplane and literally laughed out loud multiple times. But behind the humour is a serious commentary on a dilemma that we all face as teachers and letter-writers, that of balancing the duty of veracity with our obligation to place our students. It should be required reading for anyone whose job description includes writing letters of recommendation.


Arpaly, Nomy (2003) Unprincipled Virtue. Oxford University Press.

McKenna, Michael (2012) Conversation and Responsibility. Oxford University Press.

McKenna, Michael (2014) "Defending conversation and responsibility: reply to Danna Nelkin and Holly Smith," Philosophical Studies 171: 73-84.

Sher, George (2009) Who Knew? Responsibility Without Awareness. Oxford University Press.