Meaning and Mortality in Kierkegaard and Heidegger: Origins of the Existential Philosophy of Death

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Adam Buben, Meaning and Mortality in Kierkegaard and Heidegger: Origins of the Existential Philosophy of Death, Northwestern University Press, 2016, 189pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810132504.

Reviewed by Arun Iyer, Indian Institute of Technology Bombay


Adam Buben's compact book is ideally meant for the philosophically minded student of Christian theology. It is an attempt to systematize, from a strictly Christian perspective that is informed by the work of Kierkegaard, the myriad reflections in the history of Western thought on the meaning of human existence in the face of death and mortality. Kierkegaard is without doubt the central figure of this book, as the bibliography clearly indicates. However, much more significantly, the author gives himself the mission of roping in Heidegger as an ally for Kierkegaard's idiosyncratic Christian musings on death and the meaning of human existence. He uncovers in their writings the origins of an existential philosophy of death, which by combining the strengths of their Greek and Christian predecessors stands on its own against its predecessors and contemporaries from the French existential and phenomenological tradition.

Buben's discussion of the history of Western thought on death mainly serves as a backdrop against which the fundamental similarities between Kierkegaard and Heidegger on the subject matter of mortality and meaning, despite some prominent differences, can shine through. In the first two chapters, he divides the history of Western thought on death into two camps: what he calls the Platonic/Christian camp and the Epicurean camp.

For the Platonic/Christian camp, death is not the end. It is a journey into a world beyond, an after-life, in which life in this world will be judged. According to this view, death is to be taken seriously, even feared, as it has significant ramifications for our life in this world. The Platonic/Christian view also tells us that the only way to live a life that would be judged favourably in the afterlife, which would be worthy of true immortality, is a life that renounces the ways of this world, that renounces worldly existence, what Buben calls "dying to the world," whose concrete manifestation we see in the figure of Socrates and the Christian martyrs. But such a renunciation of worldly existence does not necessarily imply a monastic existence, shutting oneself from the world. The content and mode of this renunciation is a matter of debate within Christianity. For Buben, this figurative death, wherein human beings turn away from the ways of this world, die to the world, as he repeats ad nauseum, is far more significant than literal death. In some Christian thinkers, this renunciation even becomes a renunciation of reason in favour of a life lived on faith alone. Here, despite appearances, we can clearly see a difference between Platonism and Christianity, since the former does not advocate a renunciation of reason, even if it calls for a rejection of the ways of this world.

The Epicureans, by contrast, tell us that death is something absolutely insignificant and so not to be taken seriously at all. Atomists that they are, life and death, for the Epicureans, are mutually exclusive. Death, which is nothing but the unravelling of the aggregate of atoms that constitutes our bodies, is the very end. Death cannot be experienced because it is the end of all experience. Hence there is no need to take death seriously or fear it as it has no ramifications for human life. Indeed, for Buben, the Epicurean view amounts to nothing but a dissolute enjoyment of life's pleasures as death loses all meaning for human existence. He concludes that in the Epicurean view, there is no "dying to the world." Although it is not quite obvious, he places all of early modern philosophy, Hegel and Nietzsche in the Epicurean camp. All of this is done rather hastily in a few pages.

The fundamental difference between the Platonic/Christian and the Epicurean camp turns out to be former's cultivation of the fear of the death against the latter's rather brazen rejection of that fear. For, only through a cultivation of the fear of death, which Buben argues, will be advocated by both Kierkegaard and Heidegger, is it possible to reject the shallow and sinful ways of the world and live the right way. But this raises a fundamental problem. In all of Plato's works, we find not a cultivation, but an explicit rejection of the fear of death, which actually brings him quite close to Epicureans. In the Apology, the figure of Socrates makes this abundantly clear by deeming the fear of death as the very acme of irrationality.[1] In the Phaedo, Socrates is explicitly asked to calm the child in his interlocutors, who cannot but feel the fear of the death.[2] The rational life grounded on the care of the self is an explicit overcoming of that fear of death, which is seen as a principle hindrance towards living the right way. Now if living the right way requires overcoming the fear of the death, then the Epicureans and the Platonists are on the same side and the history of Western thought, especially around the notion of death, appears very different indeed from what the book portrays.

Not only that, what Buben describes as the Epicurean and the Platonic position, are encapsulated in the last paragraph of Plato's Apology. Although he alludes to this in his introduction to the second chapter, he never takes it up with the seriousness it deserves. Plato himself seems to recognize a close proximity between the two positions on death. Even in the Phaedo, the figure of Socrates insists that his final demonstration of the immortality of the soul should not be accepted without closer scrutiny, clearly[3] implying that it is nowhere close to establishing what Socrates intends to establish, subtly casting doubt on whether the immortality of the soul could be established at all. All of Plato's accounts of the afterlife, be it in the Gorgias, the Apology or the Republic, take the form of mythical narratives, not the dialectical method that is supposed to ascertain the truth. It is not quite clear whether Plato accepts the afterlife and the immortality of the soul as an established truth in the way the Christian does. This brings the Platonic view much closer to the Epicurean view. It would have been beneficial for the reader if Buben had taken up this rather significant point and problematized it further.

Buben, however, seems to indirectly acknowledge this conflict between Christianity and Platonism on the issue of surmounting the fear of death when he tries to resolve it in favour of Christianity by showing how Socrates is ultimately overcome in his reading of Kierkegaard. He begins by showing us how Kierkegaard introduces a new dimension into Christianity -- the subjective. Kierkegaard's argument is that the subjective is the only authentic perspective from which one can live one's life. From such a perspective, nothing is definite. Christianity becomes a paradox, an irresolvable paradox in which the finite and the infinite have to be affirmed at the same time, of the same being, Christ. For Kierkegaard, there cannot be any theoretical resolution of this paradox. If anything, this paradox has to be embraced and lived. To become subjective is to become aware of the finitude of human existence and cease pretending to the certainty of finding salvation in the afterlife. It involves a radical renunciation of conventional morality and the regular ways in which one relates to the world as it were. It involves transcending the very distinction between the secular and the religious. Needless to say, it requires giving up institutional Christianity with its empty certainties about God, the afterlife, the soul and the like.

To become subjective, then, is to truly embrace one's mortality and everything that comes with it. This is what it means to fear death and tremble before it. Such fear and trembling is not something merely sentimental such as fearing God's wrath or trembling before the presence of a hungry lion. It is a radically different kind of comportment that Kierkegaard in his texts struggles to articulate. This subjective fear is radically different from the objective fear of death, wherein death gets objectified as a terrible event in our lives or as the action of an all-powerful being. This subjective fear entails a dissolution of that objective fear of death, just as the Platonists and the Epicureans demand.

Buben does not seem to do justice to the radical nature of the Kierkegaardian conception of fear and its equally radical entailments, when he clarifies it in bland utilitarian terms as a "fear and worry of an appropriate sort, not asking that one become paralyzed by extreme terror, but simply suggesting that a respectful trepidation leads to a sense of urgency and an appreciation for divine assistance in maintaining one's urgently adopted course of action." (74)[4] We have to wonder from what standpoint we could perform such a utilitarian calculus of measuring just the right amount of fear that would not paralyze us but be conducive to our own actions. Would it not be an objective standpoint, a standpoint that Kierkegaard takes great pains to invalidate in favour of the subjective? Similar problems come to the fore when Buben characterizes Kierkegaard as a believer, someone who believes in God, hopes for an afterlife. It is not easy to understand what 'belief' and 'hope' would mean from within the subjective stance that Kierkegaard articulates in his works. We can be certain that our conventional understanding of 'belief' and 'hope' would have no purchase in this new radically existential stance. Hence, it is not even clear whether Kierkegaard's subjectivized Christianity would require one to be believer, as Buben claims. It seems that it would be far easier for an atheist and a pagan to enter into a sympathetic relationship with subjectivized Christianity than for a devout churchgoing Christian believer to even begin to accept what Kierkegaard is proposing.

In the last three chapters devoted to Heidegger, Buben shows a parallel between Heidegger's concept of being-toward-death and that of subjectivity in Kierkegaard. These chapters exhibit a greater focus than the scattered nature of the Kierkegaard chapters because Buben devotes himself exclusively to a close reading of a few paragraphs from Being and Time containing Heidegger's most sustained discussion on the subject matter of death. Heidegger and Kierkegaard are viewed as advocates for cultivating a fear of one's own death. Heidegger's distinction between the authentic and inauthentic modes of existence is seen to parallel the subjective and objective modes of existence in Kierkegaard. Both Heidegger and Kierkegaard call for an explicit rejection of the shallowness of everyday existence, even if it comes across as structural in Heidegger and moral in Kierkegaard.

The first major difference between Heidegger and Kierkegaard becomes one of form versus content. Despite some differences, Buben largely agrees with his fellow Kierkegaardians, who see in Being and Time a merely formal, abstract, empty but universal account of death and human existence in which theological terms are stripped of all their theological content. Kierkegaard's account, by contrast, is rich in content because of its explicit resort to Christian theology. The danger Buben sees in an empty formal account such as Heidegger's is its susceptibility to becoming a vehicle for any sort of content, even Nazi ideology.

The second major difference concerns the source from which human existence gains meaning. Restricting himself to Being and Time, Buben concludes that in Heidegger that source is nothing other than the human being's own endeavours, which would end up granting everything from Nazism to pacifism equal validity. For Kierkegaard, by contrast, this source being the human being's relationship to the divine has the advantage of putting more rigorous normative constraints on human actions. Let us address the similarity first and then go on to the differences.

Buben claims that both Heidegger and Kierkegaard encourage the cultivation of the fear of death in opposition to the Epicureans, who want us to reject death and the fear of death as a nullity. However, Kierkegaard himself can be seen as someone who overtly rejects the objective fear of death just like the Epicureans in favour of radically different subjective fear of death. In Heidegger, there is an explicit distinction between anxiety and fear (which Buben notes is also found in Kierkegaard) and the experience of anxiety entails a rejection of the fear of death. Buben devotes a footnote to this distinction. But his discussion gives the impression that he sees anxiety as nothing more than an intensified form of fear. However, in Heidegger anxiety and fear have two entirely different modes of being.[5] Indeed, Heidegger seems to be quite clear that the genuine experience of anxiety is only possible in the absence of fear, especially the fear of death.

Proceeding to the differences, we have to question whether Heidegger's account of death can be characterized as a merely formal account. It would be more accurate to say that the fundamental ontology of Being and Time is transcendental in the Kantian sense, as opposed to merely being formal, in specifying the conditions for the possibility of the everyday inauthentic understanding of death and its transformation into an authentic relationship to one's own death. What Heidegger gives us in Being and Time is a very rich picture of human existence, which structurally gravitates towards conformity, towards finding an equilibrium with its current situation and its past, wherein the future reduces itself to nothing more than a continuation of the present. Heidegger shows how difficult it is to break with this conformity and how easy it is to appear to break with it by going after the new and the exotic without really doing so.[6] Because human existence is structured in this way, something morally abhorrent can easily become cast as extremely noble.[7] It is Heidegger's implication that simply providing some normative signposts or drawing up an ethical system will not help us as these very ethical systems and normative signposts are susceptible to being manipulated and twisted into their opposites. How can revealing these transcendental structures of human existence be seen as giving tacit justification for acquiring membership of the Nazi party?

Second, Buben fails to appreciate Heidegger's characterization of human existence [Dasein] as being-in-the-world. Human beings always find themselves in a world that is not of their own choosing. They cannot simply create out of their own endeavours the very possibilities for finding meaning in this world ex nihilo. These possibilities are already there in the world and we inherit them although we may have to decide which possibilities to actualize. This is what Heidegger means by facticity. The source of the meaning of human existence in Heidegger, like in Kierkegaard, is not the endeavours of the human being, but unlike Kierkegaard, it is not the human being's relationship to God, but rather the human being's indissoluble relationship to the world -- its being-in-the-world.

Despite its many flaws, Buben's book is an admirable attempt to engage with the entire history of philosophy as well as both sides of the analytic/continental divide. It is a thought provoking book, which I would recommend to everyone, even those, like myself, unfamiliar with Christian theology.

[1] Apology 29b1

[2] Phaedo 77e5-6

[3] ibid., 107b3-7

[4] See pages 82, 90, 91, where Buben characterizes the fear of death in terms of its benefits rendered to the individual practicing that fear.

[5] Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, trans. Joan Stambaugh (SUNY Press, 1996), 177

[6] ibid., 161

[7] ibid., 158