Meaning and Normativity

Placeholder book cover

Allan Gibbard, Meaning and Normativity, Oxford University Press, 2012, 310pp., $55 (hbk), ISBN 9780199646074.

Reviewed by Christopher S. Hill, Brown University


Gibbard's book represents the most ambitious and innovative attempt to explain meaning since Paul Horwich and Robert Brandom developed their theories in the nineties. The first half offers richly detailed accounts of word meaning, analyticity, synonymy, reference, truth, and truth conditions, and the second half focuses on normative expressions, updating and extending Gibbard's celebrated expressivist account of the meanings of those terms, and integrating the account with the general theory of meaning that is developed in earlier chapters. In addition to these primary concerns, the book proposes a solution to the Kripkenstein paradox, presents a theory of the norms linking truth to belief, explores the relationships between expressivism and naturalism, argues for a set of views about the connection between believing propositions and accepting sentences, develops a story of the individuation of the objects of belief and thought, and responds to Mark Schroeder's critique of expressivism. It comments in passing on a variety of other topics, almost always in an illuminating way.

Gibbard's main claim is that linguistic meaning is normative. At various points he broadens this claim to apply to the representational contents of concepts and propositional attitudes. Many readers will come to the book with a prior commitment to a quite different view about meaning and content -- specifically, the belief that these notions have their principal home in causal explanations and are therefore largely descriptive or factual in character. This view may lead them to disagree strongly with much that Gibbard says. Even so, I predict that every reader will find the book marvelous, whatever his or her prior commitments. By the end of the book, every reader will have a larger and better grounded view of the main options in various branches of philosophy of language and metaethics, a much more adequate understanding of many smaller topics, and stronger mental muscles. There is a relentless intelligence, guided by wisdom, at work on every page.

Section I: The Normativity Thesis

Gibbard introduces his main thesis by reminding us of the following passage from Kripke's famous book about Wittgenstein:

Suppose I do mean addition by '+'. What is the relation of this supposition to the question of how I will respond to the problem 68 + 57'? The dispositionalist gives a descriptive account of this relation: if '+' meant addition, then I will answer '125'. But this is not the proper account of the relation, which is normative, not descriptive. The point is not that, if I meant addition by '+', I will answer '125', but that, if I intend to accord with my past meaning of '+', I should answer '125' . . . The relation of meaning to future action is normative, not descriptive. (Kripke 1982, p. 37)

Generalizing from this passage, Gibbard proposes that claims about meaning imply claims of obligation -- more specifically, claims about what we ought to say in response to queries, and claims to the effect that we ought to accept and reject sentences in various circumstances.

Consider, for example, the claim that "Snow is white" means that snow is white, and think of it in relation to the claim that "Nothing is white" means that nothing is white. According to Gibbard, when these claims are combined, they imply that if you ought to accept the sentence "Snow is white," then you ought to reject "Nothing is white." (p. 13) Again, consider the claim that "That thing looks blue" means that an attended object is presenting an appearance of blue. According to Gibbard, the claim implies that you ought to accept the sentence just in case you are currently attending to an object that you are experiencing as blue. (p. 130)

Actually, "means implies ought" is just one of two theses about meaning that Gibbard defends. It is the weak normativity thesis. The strong normativity thesis is that "ought" must figure in any acceptable definition of meaning: "meaning is fully definable in normative and naturalistic terms." (p. 12) In either version, the normativity of meaning is a metasemantic claim, a claim about the content of the concept of meaning, implying that talk about meaning always carries normative commitments.

What is the nature of the "ought" that Gibbard relies on in explaining the normativity thesis? He tells us that it is exceptionless, in the sense that statements involving it hold across all contexts and for all agents. It isn't an ought that applies only to people who are interested in believing the truth, or only to people who want to have degrees of conviction that are in line with the weight of evidence. It isn't an ought that applies only when agents have certain interests or occupy a certain perspective. Moreover, it is an "all things considered" ought -- an ought "that is tied to how reasons to believe combine and weigh together and against each other." (p. 14) It results from integrating over the entire array of reasons for and against a course of action, and therefore, it cannot be contradicted by such reasons.

This leaves the question of whether the relevant ought statements are subjective or objective in character. If an agent ought to accept a sentence, in the intended sense,

is this a matter of what she ought to do in the light of the information that she has available to her, or is it a matter of what she ought to do in the light of all the facts, whether or not she has any way of knowing them? (p. 75)

Gibbard answers that the oughts that are most immediately germane to meaning are subjective. Consider, for example, the claim that "That is a weasel" means that an object of attention is a weasel. This can't imply that I should accept "That is a weasel" whenever I am attending to a weasel, because it is possible to attend to a weasel without being in a position to appreciate the features that mark it as one. It might, for example, be too foggy for me to be able to distinguish weasels from fishers. The idea here seems to be that the norms that govern the use of expressions must be such that I am able to know whether or not I am conforming to them. (p. 118) Gibbard does not discuss how this perception might be related to other, prima facie similar principles, such as the Russellian doctrine that one must be acquainted with the reference of one's terms, or the view that one must be able to discriminate between the referent of a term and everything else.

Section II: A Reason for Accepting the Normativity Thesis

Gibbard gives two main reasons for embracing his views about meaning. (See p. 16 and p. 150.) I'll discuss one of them in the present section and another in the next. The first reason makes its initial appearance in Chapter 1 and is developed in somewhat different ways in later sections of the book. Roughly, it is that all attempts to give purely naturalistic or empirical accounts of meaning have failed. This is true both of general theories of meaning and of attempts to specify the meanings of certain particular expressions. So far, at any rate, it hasn't been possible for advocates of any one general theory to cite purely factual grounds for preferring their account to others. Moreover, in certain cases, anyway, it has proved difficult to find purely factual grounds for taking a particular expression to have one meaning rather than a range of others. If we are to understand why divergences of these kinds have proved so hard to resolve, we must take them to be largely normative in character, involving different views as to what theories of meaning and what particular semantic hypotheses we ought to accept.

To elaborate: Quine despaired of finding a factual basis for determining whether "gavagai" refers to rabbits, undetached rabbit parts, or undetached rabbit stages, and Kripke maintained that there are no factual grounds for preferring to treat the plus sign as standing for addition rather than a bizarre operation he called "quaddition." Gibbard thinks that Quine and Kripke were onto something, but he prefers to develop their point in terms of an example that is due to Hartry Field. (1973) As Field observed, when we compare Newtonian physics to special relativity, we find that there is no one physical quantity recognized by relativistic physics that fulfills all of Newton's claims about mass. Rather, there are two physical quantities such that each one fulfills some of the things that Newton said about mass while failing to conform to others. Moreover, the claims that each of the quantities fulfills are crucially different than the ones that the other quantity fulfills. Thus, Newtonian physics asserts that there is a single quantity, Newtonian mass, that fulfills both the principle that momentum equals mass times velocity and the principle that the mass of an entity is constant across frames of reference. Relativity theory denies this, but it claims that there is one quantity (which Field calls "relativistic mass") that fulfills the first principle, and another quantity (which Field calls "proper mass") that fulfills the second. Now the success of Newtonian physics provides a strong reason for thinking that Newton's concept of mass referred to something, but to what -- relativistic mass or proper mass? Given that the two principles are both of fundamental physical importance, it appears that there are equally good grounds for saying that Newton's concept referred to relativistic mass and for saying that it referred to proper mass. Any decision between these two hypotheses about the reference of Newton's term must be arbitrary. Or so Field maintained.

In Gibbard's more complex presentation of this example, there is an emphasis on the need to idealize away from particular assertions containing a term in order to assign it meaning. Generally speaking, if T is a theoretical term, it won't be possible to choose a referent for T that confers truth on all of the theory's assertions that contain T. One will have to discount some of the assertions as comparatively unimportant and play up others. That is, in order to find a referent, one must form an idealized picture of the role of T in the theory. Gibbard thinks that there will often be more than one way of doing this, and he takes the "mass" example to illustrate this point. We can take the principle that momentum equals mass times velocity to be the most important locus for "mass" in Newtonian physics, or we can accord this honor to the principle that mass is conserved across reference frames. From a purely factual perspective, these views are equally legitimate. As Gibbard sees it, this pattern is repeated elsewhere. Often, the relevant facts will allow us multiple ways of forming idealized pictures of use, and will therefore permit a number of ways of assigning meaning to an expression as equally valid.

Why does this support the normativity of meaning? It does so because it implies that assignments of meaning will often depend on decisions as to how best form idealized pictures of the use of expressions. Such decisions will be fundamentally normative in character because they will in effect be decisions about the relative importance of various facts. Hence, in the cases in question, at least, ascriptions of meaning will receive their warrant from normative judgments, not from sets of facts.

Whatever our final assessment of this line of thought, I think we must agree that it doesn't quite work as it stands. In its original form, Field's example involves four hypotheses. One claims that Newton's term "mass" referred to relativistic mass. Another asserts that it referred to proper mass. A third possible view is that it referred ambiguously to these two different physical quantities. The fourth hypothesis maintains that it referred to nothing. Now Field himself seems to have thought that the concept of reference has a full share of empirical or factual meaning, and that it is possible to decide among these four hypotheses on the basis of factual considerations. More specifically, he thought that facts about the use of Newton's term speak decisively in favor of the third hypothesis. Gibbard disagrees, maintaining that factual considerations fail to settle the question. On his view, this is because the concept of reference is normative. A choice among the four hypotheses must be made on the basis of normative considerations.

I am somewhat inclined to side with Field, but instead of agitating for his position, I will suppose for the sake of argument that Gibbard is right in claiming that purely factual considerations fail to determine the choice of a hypothesis in this case and point out that it doesn't follow that the commonsense concept of reference is normative. It could instead be true that the concept is simply too vague to determine a choice. That is to say, it could be that the content of the commonsense concept is factual, just as Field maintained, but that it is embedded in a folk theory that is too weak to settle certain questions about reference -- and in particular, questions like the present one, which in effect asks about the relationship between a seventeenth century term and the world as represented by a modern theory. Of course, this by no means shows that Gibbard is wrong, but it does indicate that he has more work to do. There is more than one way of understanding the alleged indeterminacy of reference. (For another response to indeterminacy arguments, see Hill forthcoming, Chapters 2 and 5.)

Section III: Another Reason for Accepting the Normativity Thesis

The second argument begins with the observation that ought-statements invariably follow from statements about meaning. It then goes on to claim that the best explanation for the entailments is that ascriptions of meaning are themselves normative in character.

In developing this argument, Gibbard discusses an alternative explanation of the entailments. We might try to account for them by viewing them as enthymemes. On this view, the entailed ought-statements do not follow immediately from the premises about meaning. Rather, the entailments are due in part to hidden background assumptions that are explicitly normative. Gibbard rejects this approach because he doubts that it can account for the fact that the entailments hold invariably and automatically -- that is, irrespective of agents' plans, interests, and background beliefs. Thus, for example, if a statement means something contradictory, it is clear that I ought not to accept it. Could this be because I have a prudential obligation to eschew contradictory statements? Gibbard thinks not. To be sure, it is normally imprudent to accept contradictions. But this can't be why I'm obliged to eschew them, for I would be obliged to eschew them even in one of the outré cases in which the practical rewards of accepting one would be astronomical. Suppose that an evil demon would change his mind about wiping out the human race if I would just embrace a contradiction. Even if this were so, it would still in a sense be true that I ought not to embrace it. Examples like this show that we should see entailments running from means-statements to ought-statements as direct and immediate, and should therefore explain them by supposing that means-statements are fundamentally normative.

Like the first argument, this one clearly deserves further development, but in its current form, I feel that it leaves opponents of the normativity thesis with a lot of logical room. Consider the following entailment:

(*) In French, "La niege est blanche" means that snow is white.

(#) Therefore, if Pierre is a speaker of French who has undefeated evidence that snow is white, Pierre ought to accept "La niege est blanche."

If I understand him properly, Gibbard would say that (#) follows immediately from (*), without the mediation of background assumptions of any kind. As he sees it, the argument isn't an enthymeme. But I have some inclination to suppose that it actually abbreviates the following more complicated argument:

First premise: In French, "La niege est blanche" means that snow is white.

Second premise: If x has undefeated evidence that p, x ought to believe that p.

Third premise; If S means that p in L, and X is a speaker of L, then X ought to accept S if X ought to believe that p.

Conclusion: If Pierre is a speaker of French who has undefeated evidence that snow is white, Pierre ought to accept "La niege est blanche."

Clearly, when (#) is put in the context of this expanded argument, we can explain its normative character without appealing to (*). It derives exclusively from the second and third premises, which are both explicitly normative. Now the second premise has no tendency to imply that meaning is normative. It clearly has nothing to do with meaning, but is rather entirely concerned with the normative relationship between evidence and belief. Moreover, while the third premise is concerned with meaning on the face of it, reflection suggests that the normative character of the premise has nothing to do with meaning. Instead of expressing a norm arising from meaning, it expresses a norm governing the internal economy of rational subjects, enjoining them to align their linguistic representations with their conceptual representations. The initial clause about meaning simply sets up a correspondence between representations of these two kinds. The "ought" is part of an instruction to the effect that the correspondence should be exploited in a certain way. In sum, it appears possible to explain the normativity of (#) without supposing that it derives from meaning. (Paul Boghossian (2005) has put forward a closely related objection.)

There is a reason for thinking that this way of looking at the inference from (*) to (#) is right. It must be granted that the inference initially strikes us as valid. The question is just whether this intuition of validity is best explained by supposing, with Gibbard, that (*) immediately entails (#), without any intervening premises, or we should instead explain (#) by saying that the inference abbreviates a more elaborate argument like the one just given. In considering this question, it is helpful to consider other inferences of more or less the same form. As I see it, we would have a different intuition if we considered an example involving a sentence that is concerned with matters that are of no interest to anyone, or an example in which accepting a sentence would cause serious emotional problems for an agent, perhaps because doing so would lead to doubts as to whether the agent's cherished daughter is innocent of a serious crime. When we are considering sentences of these kinds, it seems, we are likely to have doubts as to whether premises about their meanings entail an obligation to accept them. The reluctance to attribute entailment in such cases can be explained in a natural way if we suppose that we are implicitly aware that the inferences depend on a background premise, such as "If x has undefeated evidence that p, x ought to believe that p," but that we think of the premise as holding only under certain conditions -- specifically, the condition that it must be cognitively useful to believe the proposition that p, and the condition that it must not be emotionally harmful to believe it. Whether an argument involving such a premise works will depend on whether the proposition expressed by the target sentence satisfies the two conditions in this suppressed premise. In the original case this is true, but in these two more recent ones it isn't.

Section IV: Elaborations of the Theory

The concept of meaning is closely allied with the concepts of analyticity and synonymy. According to one traditional view, a sentence counts as analytic if it is acceptable solely on the basis of its meaning. Further, words count as synonymous if they have the same meaning, and sentences count as synonymous if their constituent words are synonymous and the sentences have the same syntactic structure, with corresponding words occupying corresponding positions. In view of these relationships, an account of the concept of meaning must be accompanied by plausible accounts of the concepts of analyticity and synonymy. Gibbard embraces this responsibility with his characteristic energy and commitment to depth of treatment. The resulting theory should be of considerable interest to philosophers of a variety of stripes, including those who think of the concept of meaning as principally empirical and descriptive in character, for it has a structure that is easily transposed to a variety of conceptual frameworks.

Gibbard begins by explicating a relationship between sentences that he calls "analytic equivalence." To stand in this relationship, sentences must be a priori equivalent, which means, in Gibbard's book, that they ought to be accepted in exactly the same evidential circumstances. But a priori equivalence seems not to be enough, for it seems that sentences can fail to be analytically equivalent even though they bear the same relationship to bodies of evidence. It is often maintained, for example, that empirical theories can be evidentially equivalent, in the sense of being equally supported by all possible evidence, while making different claims about the underlying structure of empirical reality. Accordingly, Gibbard thinks it necessary to invoke suppositions as well as relationships to actual and possible evidence, in defining analytic equivalence: "If two sentences are analytically equivalent, then the credences one ought to give them, for a given epistemic circumstance, must be equal under any intelligible supposition." (p. 122) Combining this idea with the evidential requirement, we get the view that two sentences are analytically equivalent just in case they ought to be accepted in the same evidential circumstances and under the same intelligible suppositions. Similarly, a single sentence counts as analytic if it ought to be accepted in all evidential circumstances and under all intelligible suppositions.

Reflection shows that these proposals carry considerable baggage. What is it for a supposition to be intelligible? What is it for sentences that belong to different languages to be acceptable under the same supposition? Doesn't the idea of interlinguistic sameness presuppose that we already have access to a notion of equivalence or synonymy? Gibbard faces these questions squarely and offers attractive answers.

Turning to the question of synonymy of individual words, Gibbard begins by borrowing an idea from Horwich (1998, pp. 31-2), who has argued that the meanings of a wide array of terms in natural languages are fixed by Carnap sentences constructed from theories in which the terms make their homes. Suppose that the term T owes its role in our intellectual life to a theory Θ that contains it, and let "There exists an x such that Θ(x)" be the result of replacing all occurrences of T in Θ with occurrences of a variable and binding those occurrences with an existential quantifier. Then the Carnap sentence for T is the conditional "If there exists an x such that Θ(x), then Θ(T)." In effect, the thought is that the meaning of a theoretical term can be specified by saying that it is to refer to whatever fulfills the theory that grounds our use of the term. Adding an amendment to Horwich's view, Gibbard maintains that the meaning of T is fixed by the pair consisting of the Carnap sentence for T and the closely related conditional "If there is no x such that Θ(x), then there is no x such that x = T." This is the Carnap pair for T.

Gibbard's next step is to say, in effect, that almost all words are theoretical terms, and therefore have meanings that can be captured by Carnap pairs. More specifically, he sees most of the terms of a language as arranged in a hierarchy such that the Carnap pairs for later members of the hierarchy employ only vocabulary defined by the Carnap pairs governing earlier members of the hierarchy. At the bottom of the hierarchy are terms whose meanings do not depend on Carnap sentences, and are therefore independent of the meanings of other terms, but are rather fixed by requirements to the effect that simple sentences containing them are acceptable just in case one is currently enjoying sensory experiences of certain kinds. That is to say, Gibbard opts for a kind of semantic foundationalism. He thinks that meanings of terms in our perceptual vocabulary are determined outright by conditions linking them to sense experience, and that the meanings of non-perceptual terms are determined recursively by a hierarchy of definitions, where each definition takes the form of a Carnap pair. Moreover, he thinks that this holds for any language: the perceptual terms of any language get their meanings from principles associating them with sense experiences, and the meanings of any non-perceptual terms are determined by a hierarchy of Carnap pairs.

Or at least, this is the form of the approach he recommends. The content is normative. That is to say, he thinks of the foundational requirements governing perceptual terms as consisting in obligations to accept sentences like "That thing looks blue" when enjoying certain experiences, and obligations not to accept them otherwise, and he thinks of the requirements governing higher level terms as consisting in obligations to accept Carnap pairs -- specifically, obligations to accept them in any evidential circumstance, and under all intelligible suppositions.

Given this picture of the meanings of terms, Gibbard can explain synonymy by saying, first, that two words are synonymous just in case they occupy corresponding positions in hierarchies of obligations that have similar foundations and a similar recursive structure up those positions, and second, that the traditional account of sentence-synonymy in terms of word-synonymy is correct -- two sentences are synonymous just in case they consist of synonymous words distributed in the same way within similar syntactic structures. This holds across languages as well as within languages.

According to Gibbard, then, apart from exceptions like logical words and expressions from our most fundamental perceptual vocabulary, the meanings of terms are constituted by norms enjoining acceptance of Carnap pairs in all evidential circumstances and under all intelligible suppositions. This proposal invites skepticism because there are grounds for doubting that such obligations exist. The principal doubt arises from Quinean epistemologies, which maintain that it is in principle possible for empirical evidence to mandate the rejection of any sentence, even including laws of logic and mathematics. These views deny that we have obligations of the sort that Gibbard specifies. But if we don't have such obligations, it follows from his theory that our terms lack meaning altogether, and fail to bear relations of synonymy to one another. Of course, it would be possible for him to scale his theory back to the claim that meanings are fixed by obligations to accept Carnap pairs in some but not all epistemic situations, and for some but not all suppositions; but then he would face the problem of distinguishing in a principled way between the situations and suppositions that are relevant to meaning and those that are not. On the face of it, this problem is quite challenging. Rather than scale back the theory, it seems that it would be a better strategy to meet Quinean epistemological views head on by arguing that they get things wrong. It may be possible for Gibbard to do this, but as far as I can see, an answer to Quine would require ideas that are not made available in the book. Also, I worry that an answer might require assumptions that Gibbard would not find congenial. (This may be true, for example, of the answer that is offered in Hill 2013.)

There are also grounds for concern about a different aspect of his theory, the idea that the meanings of non-perceptual terms are fixed by Carnap sentences. As is well known, while cognitive scientists allow that we often rely on theories in applying concepts and terms, they also think that the use of concepts and words is to a large extent governed by prototypes and collections of exemplars. Theories can generally be captured by Carnap sentences, but this is not true of the other devices. Prototypes encode large amounts of statistical information, and collections of exemplars often encompass memories of large numbers of past experiences. Generally speaking, their contents are not articulable, in the sense that their users would not be capable of translating them into explicit beliefs or sentences. Moreover, the cognitive agencies that regulate the use of these devices in categorization are not accessible to us, and therefore could not be coded in propositional representations. It is controversial whether prototypes and collections of exemplars are constitutively related to meanings, but they seem to have as good a claim to semantic relevance as many theories. Accordingly, there is ground for worry that Gibbard's theory is too intellectualistic -- that it overemphasizes the role of propositional knowledge in fixing meanings.

Section V: Plans

Apart from giving a preliminary characterization of ought-judgments as all-things-considered and irreducible to hypothetical imperatives, Gibbard treats such judgments as primitives in the first seven chapters. The last three chapters offer an account of them. The main idea is that believing one ought to do something is like having a plan to do it -- a conditional plan in most cases. To judge that one ought to go on a picnic tomorrow if the weather is good is tantamount to having a conditional plan for a picnic. Gibbard explains plans for action as functional states that lead directly to acts of will. To plan for a picnic if the weather is good is to be disposed to will to go on a picnic once one has vetted the weather. He also offers an account of willing: "The willing governs what I do, monitoring my action as it unfolds and keeping it on track." (p. 171)

Gibbard modifies the commonsense notion of a plan in several ways. Thus, since his theory of meaning invokes obligations to form beliefs in various evidential circumstances, he is committed to saying that there can be plans for forming beliefs, or, more precisely, for changing existing degrees of credence. This enlarges the ordinary conception of planning, which is principally concerned with plans for performing actions. Another departure from the commonsense conception is motivated by the fact that we make ought-judgments of various kinds about agents other than ourselves. If Gibbard is to explain such judgments in terms of plans, he must give an account of plans that accords agents the ability to form plans concerning what to do in the shoes of other agents. Thus, since, I can judge that Caesar ought to have turned back from the Rubicon instead of proceeding towards Rome, it must be possible for me to form a plan that would lead me to turn back if I were to find myself in Caesar's circumstances. Because of these two departures, and others, Gibbard often speaks of "plans" rather than plans.

Gibbard is at pains to explain and defend this expanded notion of planning. Some of his efforts go toward describing the functional role of plans to form beliefs, but he is mainly concerned to explain how it is possible for an agent to adopt a plan concerning what to do if he were to find himself in the shoes of someone else. The latter task is complex and delicate, because being in the shoes of another agent may involve having beliefs or purposes that are not compatible with choosing the envisioned action. How can I plan to turn back from the Rubicon if I were in Caesar's shoes, given that being in his shoes led him to choose crossing the river and heading on to Rome, apparently without much consideration being given to the alternative? The core of Gibbard's answer is that being in the shoes of another agent is a matter of being in the agent's epistemic shoes, but this core needs qualification, and the full answer has other parts.

Having elaborated a theory of plans, Gibbard turns to the task of combining the theory with his account of meaning. According to this combined theory, to judge that a sentence in my idiolect means that p is to form a plan to use the sentence in a certain way. Further, to judge that a sentence in someone else's idiolect means that p is to plan to use it in the given way if one should be in that other person's shoes. Judgments of synonymy are explained as follows:

What does it mean to say that Pierre's sentence 'Les chiens aboient' is synonymous with my present sentence 'Dogs bark'? What is the state of mind of someone who believes this claim of synonymy? To believe this claim is to be in a state of planning . . . Roughly, Clara believes this synonymy claim if she plans to use the sentence 'Les chiens aboient' if she is Pierre as she plans to use the sentence 'Dogs bark' in case she is me. The crucial aspect of use here is accepting or rejecting the sentence in various epistemic circumstances. (pp. 179-80)

These ideas are developed with care and ingenuity in Chapter 8.

Chapters 9 and 10 deal with problems about ought-judgments and plans that arise from the forementioned views, explore the question of whether Gibbard's theory of meaning and his expressivist theory of normative language fit comfortably together, and they consider how the claims of the book might be integrated with a broadly naturalistic perspective on human nature. The chapters are interesting and advance the discussion in important ways, but I cannot discuss them here.

Section VI: Naturalism

I will wind up with a short inquiry into the relationships between Gibbard's theory of meaning and naturalistic theories.

Naturalists tend to think of linguistic meaning as a causal-explanatory in character, and they have a similar view about mental content -- the type of content that is possessed by concepts and propositional attitudes. There are good reasons for these views. Suppose my friend Ivan says, "I'll meet you at Irv's at 3. Bring your chess board." It is because his sentences have the meaning they do, and because I know those meanings, that I show up at Irv's Restaurant at 3 with a chess board under my arm. Equally, it is because I know the meaning of "Fresh corn today" that I am able to recognize that a roadside stand is selling something that I'd like for dinner, and accordingly pull off the road. Examples like this provide motivation for the view that there are facts of meaning, or at least facts involving knowledge of meaning, in a rather thick sense of "fact." How could my knowledge of meaning help to cause my behavior unless that knowledge was empirically robust?

Can Gibbard's theory of meaning accommodate these observations? Yes and no. Although he maintains that the concept of meaning is fundamentally normative, he also holds that meanings supervene on empirical properties. (pp. 221-22) This combination of views allows that meanings can have causal powers. It implies, however, that meanings have such powers solely in virtue of their supervenience base. Meanings do not have causal powers qua meanings. This contrasts sharply with semantic naturalism, which implies that meanings do have causal powers qua meanings. Gibbard's position is clearly the more complicated of the two, and it therefore carries a larger burden of proof. Naturalism seems to provide the default way of accommodating the causal powers of meanings.

I turn now to a different set of issues, beginning with a question about the contents of concepts and attitudes. Gibbard is strongly inclined to think that belief can in many cases be assimilated to acceptance of sentences, and that in all such cases, mental content can be assimilated to linguistic meaning. But this view leaves us without an account of a large range of beliefs, including all of the beliefs studied by primatologists and other cognitive ethologists, and all of the beliefs that developmentalists like Susan Carey assign to core cognition. Moreover, if concept empiricists like Lawrence Barsalou and Jesse Prinz are right, many of the beliefs of adult human beings are couched in nonlinguistic representational schemes.

Interestingly, Gibbard is prepared to acknowledge these points. He grants that there is such a thing as nonlinguistic representation, and that we will want to explain it in selectionist-cum-teleological terms. (p. 237) He doubts, however, that these observations tell us much about linguistic meaning. More specifically, he doubts that an account of nonlinguistic representation will scale up so as to afford appropriately precise explanations of meanings that attach to words and sentences. "This is where normative concepts enter the story." (p. 237)

There are grounds for taking a somewhat different view. We know that more or less innate representational schemes can contain concepts that are reasonably high level, such as the concept of object and restricted versions of the concepts of causation, agency, and number. Moreover, it appears possible to acquire significantly more sophisticated concepts, such as the concepts needed to represent dominance hierarchies and family relationships, by learning routines that don't require assistance from language. Presumably we will want to give informational or teleosemantic accounts of the contents of these concepts, just as we do for purely perceptual representations, though the contents of learned concepts will require somewhat separate treatment. This raises the question: why not give similar accounts of the meanings of words? Why not see words as having informational or teleosemantic meanings, at least in many cases? Gibbard might answer that naturalistic accounts of these kinds are in principle incapable of supporting precise and determinate assignments of linguistic meaning. But whether this is true or not, it seems that there is a naturalistic story to be told about the representational properties of words and sentences. Even if Gibbard is right in thinking that this story will fail to assign fully determinate contents to expressions, that does not deprive it of interest. As far as I can see, it makes sense to develop a naturalistic account of linguistic meaning, doing one's best to resolve indeterminacies, but tolerating them if they prove stubborn.

Perhaps, then, it is appropriate to envision two divergent approaches to meaning -- one that focuses on the ordinary concept of meaning and seeks to spell out its content by conceptual analysis, and another that deploys a notion of meaning that is descriptive and explanatory in character, and is committed to investigating the informational and teleosemantic properties of expressions. What I wish to suggest is that Gibbard's insightful investigation of the ordinary concept has no tendency to diminish the importance of the latter approach. What about the importance of the former approach? Gibbard will, I believe, argue for the significance of that approach by saying that it supports precise and determinate assignments of meaning to linguistic representations. Even if we accept this claim, however, we might wonder whether much can be gained by looking at expressions through a normative lens. Suppose I adopt norms that favor translating "lapin" by "rabbit" rather than "undetached rabbit part," even though I believe that the two English expressions are informationally and teleosemantically equivalent. What exactly would this buy me, apart from a simpler translation manual? (I mean here to be echoing a question raised in Quine 1960 (pp. 61-6).) And if there's nothing other than practical convenience to be gained by looking at language through a normative lens, why stick with the ordinary concept of meaning rather than jettisoning it in favor of a notion of meaning that is grounded in information and/or teleology? We could enjoy the practical advantages of simple translations even if we didn't seek to motivate them by claims about meaning.

I don't want to overemphasize the disagreement here. It is clear that Gibbard would endorse much that I have said in recent paragraphs about the possibility and desirability of developing a naturalistic theory of communication and meaning (though he might prefer to speak of "meaning"). Indeed, towards the end of the Preface (pp. ix-x), he sketches a strategy, based on broadly teleosemantic ideas, for developing a theory of this sort. It is clear that he sees such a strategy as complementary to the project of conceptual analysis that he undertakes in the book. Insofar as we differ, it is because I am less inclined to think that there are in-principle limits to what a naturalistic approach to meaning and content might be able to achieve, and because I am more inclined to see the ordinary concept of meaning as designed to serve causal-explanatory purposes, and therefore more inclined to see it as a naturalistic instrument. Perhaps Gibbard will say more about the naturalistic program in semantics, and its relationship to the project of the present book, in future work.

Section VII: Conclusion

I hope that this splendid book will find a wide audience. It is wonderfully stimulating, opening up vast new territories for investigation. Moreover, while the jury is still out on this, its answers to questions in its intended domain may turn out to be correct!


I have been helped considerably by extensive conversations about the book, in the context of a reading group, with James Dreier, Alexandra King, and Joshua Schechter. I also owe a large debt to Allan Gibbard, who gave me very helpful comments on earlier versions of this review.


Boghossian, Paul. (2005). "Is Meaning Normative?" in Christian Nimtz and Ansgar Beckermann (eds.), Philosophy -- Science -- Scientific Philosophy. Paderborn: Mentis Verlag, 2005.

Field, Hartry. (1973). "Theory Change and the Indeterminacy of Reference," The Journal of Philosophy 70: 462-481.

Hill, Christopher S. (2013). "Concepts, Teleology, and Rational Revision," in Albert Casullo and Joshua Thurow (eds.), The A Priori in Philosophy. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hill, Christopher S. (forthcoming). Meaning, Mind, and Knowledge. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Horwich, Paul. (1998). Meaning. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Kripke, Saul A. (1982). Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1982.

Quine, W. V. (1960). Word and Object. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.