Meaning, Basic Self-Knowledge, and Mind: Essays on Tyler Burge

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Frapolli, Maria and Romero, Esther (eds.), Meaning, Basic Self-Knowledge, and Mind: Essays on Tyler Burge, CSLI Publications, 2003, 299pp, ISBN 1575863472.

Reviewed by Sanford C. Goldberg, University of Kentucky


In Meaning, Basic Self-Knowledge, and Mind, María Frápolli and Esther Romero have assembled twelve critical essays discussing themes associated with Tyler Burge’s anti-individualism regarding the individuation of attitude-kinds, with replies by Burge to each of the twelve essays. Although various themes are discussed, three emerge as dominant: assessments of the case for or against Burge-style anti-individualism; the compatibility of anti-individualism and first-person authority; and the relation between externalist theories of linguistic meaning and anti-individualistic approaches to mental content. Most of the papers collected in this volume were presented at a conference entitled, “The First-Person, Other Minds, and Interlocution,” that took place in Granada, Spain, in May of 1996 (with Burge in attendance). In addition to papers presented there, the present volume contains three papers especially solicited for the volume (written by Chris Gauker, Martin Davies, and Steven Davis).

Without a doubt, the topics of the present volume are important ones, arguably at the heart of contemporary metaphysics and epistemology. They are also topics that are presently receiving a good deal of sustained attention in the literature. In the last six years alone, I count no less than four volumes devoted in whole or in large part to these themes: Externalism and Self-Knowledge (eds. P. Ludlow and N. Martin, CSLI Press, 1997), which collects previously published materials that have been seminal to the externalism/self-knowledge debate; Knowing Our Own Minds (eds. C. Wright, B. Smith, and C. Macdonald, Oxford University Press, 2000), which has several selections of previously unpublished essays from various authors devoted to externalism and self-knowledge; New Essays on Semantic Externalism and Self-Knowledge (ed. S. Nucettelli, MIT Press, 2003), which collects previously unpublished essays from various authors; and The Externalist Challenge: New Studies on Cognition and Intentionality, edited by R. Schantz (Walter de Gruyter, Berlin, 2003), which collects new essays from a variety of authors on semantic externalism broadly construed. It is worth noting as well that a soon-to-be published volume will bear even more directly on the themes discussed in Frápolli and Romero’s collection. I refer here to Reflections and Replies: Essays on the Philosophy of Tyler Burge, edited by M. Hahn and B. Ramberg (MIT Press, to be released in late 2003 or early 2004), which collects new essays from some of philosophy’s most influential authors on a broad range of topics relating to Burge’s anti-individualism, and which also includes replies from Burge to each of the contributions. (For the purpose of full disclosure, I must mention as well Externalism and Internalism in Semantics and Epistemology, ed. S. Goldberg, Oxford University Press, in preparation.)

As a result of this saturation, any volume that treats these topics will inevitably be compared to the several other recent related volumes. Unfortunately, against this background, Frápolli and Romero’s collection does not fare particularly well. It is not that there are no interesting papers in this collection; there are several (more on which below). It is rather that a good many of the papers in this collection fail to appreciate the subtleties of Burge’s own views, and as a result fail to develop the debates they aim to address. This is a disappointment, not only because Burge himself has developed his views explicitly in various publications in the past twenty years, taking account of many of the issues that are raised in this collection; but also because by my estimation there is still room for both development and criticism of those views.

Given limitations of space I will restrict myself to discussing those papers taking up the anti-individualism/self-knowledge debate. Anti-individualism tells us that many of an individual’s attitude-kinds depend for their individuation on worldly (social or physical) features that do not supervene on the intrinsic, physical states of the individual herself. But (as Martin Davies so wonderfully puts it) no one has access ’from the armchair’ to these worldly features. The result is that it can seem mysterious how we can have armchair access to our own intentional mental events (occurrent thoughts). It is in this context that Burge (1988) first introduced the notion of ’basic self-knowledge,’ understood to be (in Burge’s most recent words) “the sort of self-knowledge that is illustrated by variations on the cogito” (Frápolli and Romero, p. 282). Examples include such judgments as are expressed by, “I judge that water is more common than mercury” and “I think (with this very thought) that writing requires concentration.” Burge pointed out that such judgments are direct and non-empirical. They are also (he noted) self-verifying: in these cases one thinks the thought or makes the judgment in the very act of self-ascribing it. The burden of Burge 1988 was then to show that anti-individualism poses no threat to basic self-knowledge. His (by now) familiar idea was that the very conditions that go into individuating the first-order thought also go into individuating the second-order, self-ascriptive thought, rendering impossible brute error in the second-order, self-ascriptive thought. Burge1988 went on to diagnose the worry that anti-individualism might undermine basic self-knowledge as based on an illicit assumption to the effect that knowledge that p requires knowing that all of the preconditions for knowing that p have in fact obtained.

Burge’s case for the thesis that anti-individualism poses no threat to basic self-knowledge has succeeded in convincing many, but pockets of resistance remain. Several of the papers in this collection aim to develop this discussion, with mixed results. Carlos Moya’s contribution, “Externalism, Inclusion, and Knowledge of Content,” aims to defend Burge’s thesis against what Moya sees as a new worry that arises on the assumption that mental contents must be transparent to the thinker. Unfortunately, though, nothing that Moya says in defense of this assumption – for example, citing Dummett’s and Boghossian’s case for transparency – addresses points Burge (1978; 1988; 1989) and others (Owens 1986; Falvey and Owens 1994) have made against transparency. The result is that Moya’s positive proposal, devised to deal with the problem arising from the assumption of transparency, is unmotivated. Daniel Quesada’s contribution “Basic Self-Knowledge and Externalism,” which aims to defend Burge’s thesis in the face of what Quesada sees as a worry about would-be singular thought in cases involving hallucination, fails to have Burge’s own position in its sight, since Burge himself has never been one to treat the propositional content of singular thoughts as object-involving (Burge explicitly makes this point in connection with the self-knowledge debate in footnote 8 of his (1988)). Frápolli and Romero’s own contribution, “Anti-Individualism and Basic Self-Knowledge,” tries to connect Burge’s discussion of basic self-knowledge to Donnellan’s influential discussion of the referential use of descriptions. As they see it, the connection is by way of the mechanism that ensures the self-verifying nature of the relevant (basic-self-knowledge-expressing) judgments. With some qualifications that need not concern us here, Frápolli and Romero take Burge to hold that the judgment expressed by “I think (with this very thought) that writing requires concentration” is best analyzed (à la Davidson’s characterization of indirect speech reports) as

I think this → [Writing requires concentration]

(Frápolli and Romero, p. 140; arrow and brackets in the original). They then go on to argue that, as a result, the sort of knowledge one has in basic self-knowledge is a kind of metalinguistic knowledge – with the further result that Burge’s reflections on basic self-knowledge do not speak to the worries regarding anti-individualism’s implications for first-person authority. But I fear that the metalinguistic construal they offer betrays a misunderstanding of Burge’s own account of basic self-knowledge: as Burge has noted on various occasions, in the judgments that constitute basic self-knowledge one does not merely point to the thought one is thinking, one thinks the thought in the very act of self-ascribing it. Without further argument, the charge that Burge renders basic self-knowledge metalinguistic, in a way that affects the soundness of his case for the compatibility of anti-individualism and basic self-knowledge, does not stick.

The failure of these papers to connect up with Burge’s developed position is a disappointment, since it seems to me that there are unresolved issues regarding the position that results when one combines Burge’s reflections on basic self-knowledge with his anti-individualistic approach to the attitudes. Some of the questions that might be profitably asked include: how does the knowledge one has, when one knows (e.g.) that one oneself is thinking that water is wet, relate to what we might pretheoretically call one’s empirical knowledge of water? And: is what one knows, when one knows that one oneself is thinking that water is wet, incompatible with what one is alleged not to know, in any of the would-be incompatibilist arguments from world-switching (for example, in Boghossian 1989)? To be sure, the contributions just mentioned do pick up on these matters. Quesada’s paper suggests (in the spirit of Brewer 2000) that knowledge of one’s own water-thoughts depends on the availability of an empirical route (either direct or via interlocutors) to knowledge of the existence of water, and Frápolli and Romero go so far as to distinguish between “two senses of knowing our thoughts” (p. 143). But even so, these discussions are less than fully satisfactory, given their failure to mark or appreciate the various subtleties of Burge’s position. (This is true as well of the other discussions of these matters found in the present volume, for example in Tobies Grimaltós’ “Terms and Content” and Jorge Rodríguez Marqueze’s “On Orthodox and Heterodox Externalisms”.)

To my mind, two of the best articles of the collection are those by Steven Davis and Antoni Gomila Benejam. Davis’ “Arguments for Externalism” offers a shrewd comparison and assessment of the various thought experiments of Putnam, Donnellan, and Burge; Davis makes very clear how the resulting positions vary in strength and plausibility. And Benejam’s “Thought Experiments and Semantic Competence” raises the intriguing question of how our semantic competence can be seen to underlie our use of thought experiments to establish philosophical theses of general interest (although I found less than compelling Benejam’s attempt to use his answer to this question as a criticism of Burge’s thought experiments).

In addition, Martin Davies’ “Externalism, Self-Knowledge, and the Transmission of Warrant” develops his influential failure-of-warrant-transmission response to the worry that anti-individualism and first-person authority entail the possibility of armchair knowledge of empirical facts. In so doing he builds on the view he develops in Davies (1998 and 2003). (To the best of my knowledge, Burge’s extended reply to Davies is the first time Burge has addressed warrant-transmission considerations in print.) And Chris Gauker’s “Social Externalism and Linguistic Communication” raises some interesting issues regarding how to square our account of semantic content with an adequate account of linguistic communication. In this regard it is worth noting that there is an intriguing suggestion, not only in Gauker’s paper (at p. 16 of Frápolli and Romero) but also in Manual Liz’s “Intentional States: Individuation, Explanation, and Supervenience” (at p. 208 in Frápolli and Romero), that an adequate account of communication will have to appeal to an anti-individualistic account of the meaning of words. This suggestion strikes me as intriguing since it suggests the further possibility of a novel sort of argument for anti-individualism itself – one whose crucial premise would assert the prevalence of successful communication, and whose conclusion would assert one or another anti-individualistic thesis regarding meaning and/or mental content. I do not know whether Gauker or Liz would endorse the claim that such a project is worth pursuing; but such a project would be in keeping with points Burge himself has recently made (see Burge 1999, esp. p. 243), and in any case it is a project that strikes me as well worth pursuing (see Goldberg (2004)).

In sum, this volume is a mixed bag. It does contain several interesting discussions of themes that are central to contemporary metaphysics and epistemology; Burge’s replies to the various papers fill in some of the details of the position he has been developing for some time; but there are also several contributions that fail to advance the debate in any significant way.


Boghossian 1989: “Content and Self-Knowledge.” Philosophical Topics 17: 5-26.

Brewer 2000: “Externalism and A Priori Knowledge of Empirical Facts.” In Boghossian and

Peacocke, eds., New Essays on the A Priori (Oxford: Oxford University Press), pp. 415-33.

Burge 1978: “Belief and Synonymy.” Journal of Philosophy 75: 119-38.

Burge 1988: “Individualism and Self-Knowledge.” Journal of Philosophy 85: 649-63.

Burge 1989: “Wherein is Language Social?” in A. George, ed. Reflections on Language (Blackwell), pp. 175-191.

Burge 1999: “Comprehension and Interpretation.” In Lewis Hahn, ed., The Philosophy of Donald Davidson (Chicago: Open Court Press), pp. 229-50.

Davies 1998: “Externalism, architecturalism, and epistemic warrant.” In Wright, Smith, and

Macdonald, eds. Knowing Our Own Minds (Oxford: Oxford University Press), pp. 321-61.

Davies 2003: “The Problem of Armchair Knowledge.” In Nuccetelli, ed., New Essays on Semantic Externalism and Self-Knowledge. (Cambridge: MIT Press), pp. 23-56.

Falvey and Owens 1994: “Externalism, Self-Knowledge, and Skepticism.” Philosophical Review103: 107-137.

Goldberg 2004: “Radical Interpretation, Understanding, and Testimonial Transmission.” Synthese 138:3 (Forthcoming, March 2004).

Owens 1986: “Synonymy and the Non-Individualistic Model of the Mental.” Synthese 66: 361-382.