Meaning Diminished: Toward Metaphysically Modest Semantics

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Kenneth A. Taylor, Meaning Diminished: Toward Metaphysically Modest Semantics, Oxford University Press, 2019, 206pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198803447.

Reviewed by Derek Ball, University of St Andrews, and Matthew Cameron, Yukon College


Can we learn about metaphysics by analysing the meanings of our words or the contents of our concepts? Kenneth A. Taylor’s book is a well-written, opinionated introduction to this question. Taylor’s answer is broadly negative: semantics cannot tell us much about metaphysics. In the course of developing this answer, Taylor discusses a broad range of issues: the metaphysical commitments of natural language semantics construed as a part of generative grammar, the metaphysics of semantic values, conceptual analysis, and the possibility that there is a radical mismatch between natural language and the world, among others.

Taylor died unexpectedly in December 2019. One of the virtues of this, his last book, is that it situates many debates in relation to his previous work, and therefore is a valuable guide to anyone interested in developing a full picture of his thought.

The book would also be useful as a primer for someone with relatively little knowledge of these issues, as it clearly lays out some of the key points of extant debate and helpfully situates them within the broader context of philosophical thinking going back to Kant’s Critique of Pure Reason. (A note of caution for the curious but uninitiated: at times, Taylor’s terminology is somewhat idiosyncratic, and it may require some work to relate Taylor’s conclusions to other presentations of related material.) Overall, Taylor is more interested in painting a sweeping picture with a broad brush than in developing his arguments in detail, and in many cases the positions he defends are familiar ones; for this reason, those already au fait with the literature may judge that the book doesn’t do a great deal to advance the debate.

Taylor suggests that a number of recent philosophers have drawn metaphysical conclusions on the basis of substantive semantic theses; he offers as examples Davidson’s work on action verb sentences and events, Kripke’s work on natural kind terms and natural kinds, Peter Ludlow’s work on tensed language and time, and Jason Stanley’s work on know-wh constructions and knowledge how. With these examples in mind, Taylor’s main objective is to get a clear grip on the extent to which metaphysical insight into the nature and existence of real world objects and phenomena can be gleaned from semantic analysis of natural language expressions. He sketches two broad approaches to semantic analysis: narrowly linguistic semantics (which he associates with the generative linguistic tradition associated with Chomsky and others) and broadly philosophical semantics (which encompasses a variety of views about meaning and conceptual analysis, to which we will turn in the next paragraph). One main claim is that the core assumptions of narrowly linguistic semantics are inherently neutral when it comes to metaphysics. In other words, the theoretical posits that anchor semantics offer no reason to expect semantic analysis to deliver substantive metaphysical insight into the aspects of the world to which much of our language purports to make reference. Any metaphysical conclusions to be drawn on the basis of semantic analysis will need to be bolstered by independently established metaphysical theses. Taylor’s point here is plausible (and broadly familiar, e.g., from Chomsky (2000)). In fact, Taylor does little to motivate the opposing position, and one might come away from his discussion wondering why anyone might have thought that narrowly linguistic semantics might be relevant to metaphysics.

Taylor contrasts two approaches to broadly philosophical semantics. To a first approximation, ideational approaches have it that what a word or concept picks out is determined by descriptive information associated with it, and hence that part of the job of semantics is to produce an account of this descriptive information, while referential approaches have it that the job of semantics is just to say ‘what, if any, real existents the expressions of our language, from the simple to the complex, have as their assigned semantic values’ (39, emphasis in original). As Taylor presents it, these two approaches to semantics suggest two different approaches to metaphysical inquiry. The ideationalist is likely to adopt the methodology of conceptual analysis, according to which a priori investigation of semantics and conceptual content is thought to be capable of yielding metaphysical truths about both what exists and the nature of that which exists. The referential approach, by contrast, has it that metaphysical truths are yielded through direct interrogation of the real world and its furniture, rather than by way of the concepts and bits of language that we use to represent those realities. Although Taylor’s allegiance to the referential approach is evident throughout the book, he does not explicitly say much in its favour; his reasons for accepting it are instead left to be inferred from the arguments he proffers against the ideational approach. (More generally, Taylor’s use of the literature on relevant issues related to analysis and philosophical methodology is very selective; for example, neither Paul Boghossian’s work nor Timothy Williamson’s appear in the bibliography.)

Taylor has at least two main lines of argument against the ideational approach. One — which he motivates against Strawson, Frege, Thomasson, Scanlon, and others — is that our concepts might turn out to be empty. ‘In the general case, there will be no antecedent guarantee that the direct interrogation of concepts alone will suffice on its own to establish that anything in the world answers to the relevant concepts’ (51); even if words are associated with descriptions that determine what they refer to if they refer at all, conceptual analysis cannot tell us whether anything satisfies the description. The other turns on the claim that the theories we associate with concepts — including those claims that we take to be analytic or conceptual truths — change over time. Since we now regard much of what we once supposed to be conceptually true of (say) solidity to be false, we should be sceptical that what we now take to be conceptually true is true in fact. (Though Taylor does not present the issue in quite this way, one might be reminded of pessimistic induction arguments against scientific realism; one can read Taylor as mounting a kind of pessimistic induction against realism about the results of conceptual analysis.) Taylor suggests that we should regard the theories associated with a concept as a way of possessing that concept. On his view, the ancient Greeks possessed the same concept of water as we do, but they possessed it in a very different way; and we should expect this to result in different judgments about (for example) metaphysically relevant modal claims. (Taylor also alludes at several points to recent literature on ‘conceptual engineering’. This is somewhat puzzling, since on his view concepts don’t typically change in the cases he is concerned with; new theories are engineered, but concepts stay the same across change in theory. But in any case, Taylor does not engage with this literature in any detail.)

Taylor argues that natural languages might mislead us about even very basic elements of the metaphysics. For example, he claims that the adicity of an argument-taking expression can mislead us as to the metaphysics of the entities the expression picks out. For example, a verb like ‘hit’ is lexically encoded to take two arguments: an agent — the individual that does the hitting, and a theme — the individual that is hit. According to Taylor, the fact that a piece of language like ‘hit’ requires two individuals to be related to the action is one thing, whereas the fact, if it be such, that hitting metaphysically requires both an individual that is a hitter and one that is hit, is another thing. The latter cannot automatically be inferred on the basis of the former — at least not in the absence of further metaphysical argument.

One familiar response to the possibility that language provides fewer relata than metaphysics requires is to postulate unarticulated constituents: elements that enter into the proposition expressed by an assertion of a sentence, but do not correspond to anything in the sentence used to make the assertion. (For example, it is sometimes held that an assertion of ’It’s raining’ expresses a proposition that is true just in case it is raining at a particular place — for example, the proposition that it is raining in St Andrews.) Taylor rejects this response. He points out that we do not seem to need such unarticulated constituents in other cases: while ‘dances’ takes only one mandatory argument (e.g., ‘Laura dances’), from a metaphysical perspective, dancing would appear necessarily to occur at a particular location; yet, ‘One can clearly make a fully determinate, fully truth-evaluable claim about Laura and her dancing . . . without either explicitly or tacitly referring to or quantifying over the place or places where Laura did her dancing’ (134). Taylor concludes that the felt need for unarticulated constituents in cases like ‘rain’ is due to lexical features of the verb rather than anything metaphysical. In further support of the idea that what is at issue here is linguistic rather than metaphysical, Taylor observes that different languages encode properties of what seem to be metaphysically identical events and actions differently (his example is Spanish and English verbs of motion).

Taylor’s response to mismatches between language and metaphysics — as he says, ‘metaphysical embarrassments’ — is to appeal to ‘rules of use’, which ‘license us in making assertions — or assertion like linguistic moves — that need not be strictly literally true in order to be fully acceptable’ (153-4). Taylor thinks that discourse governed by something other than a norm of truth is common: this is his explanation of much of our talk about fiction, as well as our talk of weight (as though it were an intrinsic property), the rising of the sun — and presumably Taylor would regard it as possible that our talk of dancing and hitting should be regarded in this way as well. The claim that ‘Sherlock Holmes is a detective’ is assertible but not true is plausible enough; but the claim that ‘I weigh 195 pounds’ or ‘Ken dances’ is assertible but not true is considerably more surprising. In defense of this claim, Taylor argues that even uses of language that are responsive to rules of use (rather than truth) need not be indifferent to truth, since there are ‘neighboring truths’ (156) that support our usage. For example, our use of unrelativised ‘weight’ talk is supported by truths about mass; therefore, Taylor suggests, ‘we mostly do not end up saying things that are wildly off base’ (156). This is a promising suggestion, but Taylor gives us only this hint; and much recent work on varieties of realism and anti-realism in philosophy of science indicates that the devil is in working out the details of views of this kind.

Taylor is keen to deny that these observations entail that language gives us no cognitive access whatsoever to metaphysics. We can think in terms of a spectrum of potential metaphysical insight. On one end of that spectrum — metaphysical transparency — a priori analysis of our words and thoughts reveals the fundamental metaphysical structure of the world and its inhabitants (think Wittgenstein’s Tractatus-era theory of language). On the other end of the spectrum — metaphysical opacity — a priori analysis of our words and thoughts reveals nothing of the fundamental metaphysical structure of the world and its inhabitants (think a kind of error theory writ large). In between these two extremes would seem to exist a range of possibilities according to which semantic/conceptual analysis provides us with (some degree of) evidence, perhaps defeasible, about the metaphysical structure of the world and its inhabitants. What all such possibilities in between the extremes share is the commitment to some degree of mismatch — or embarrassment — between language and metaphysics. Though Taylor’s position would seem to fall closer to opacity than to transparency, he writes that ‘it would be astounding if natural languages were entirely metaphysically opaque’ (142); but he never explains exactly how his position avoids commitment to opacity: once we’ve admitted that semantics is neither a reliable guide to what exists nor to the nature of that which exists, what grounds are there for maintaining that semantics offers any insight into metaphysics?

Perhaps the beginnings of an answer can be found in the last chapter, entitled ‘A Way Forward in Semantics and Metaphysics’. There, Taylor provides a ‘brief and illustrative sketch of the explanatory potential of a metaphysics that pursues the way of reference in metaphysics’ (169). He asks us to imagine Martians attempting to understand freedom. The Martians begin by noting circumstances in which people tend to apply the word ‘freedom’: to adults, who are not coerced, not mentally ill, and so on; and go on to develop a ‘theory of the workings of the mature intact human brain’ that includes ‘what in the brain distinguishes the responsible from those who are not liable to be held responsible’ (173). The Martians feel satisfied with this as at least the beginning of an account of freedom; but they are surprised to discover that Earthling philosophers and theologians have approached the issue differently, and that much of their debate turns on issues of determinism and contra-causal freedom — issues that (according to Martian observations) ‘play no actual role, in ordinary circumstances, in licensing or blocking ascriptions of freedom and responsibility’ (176). They conclude that Earthling philosophers ‘have been bewitched by ideology’ (176) — an ideology built on pre-scientific misconceptions about the nature of humans and the world.

Taylor’s suggestion is that philosophical semanticists and metaphysicians should be like the Martians; the moral of the story as Taylor sees it is: ‘Interrogate the phenomena . . . Do not interrogate your ideas and concepts — at least not as the first or principle [sic] objects of inquiry’ (178). But this conclusion seems to neglect some of Taylor’s own insights. His Martian methodology presupposes that freedom exists and that the word ‘freedom’ is by and large correctly employed. But freedom might be like witches: perhaps there is no such thing. Or perhaps there is such a thing, but it is not found in the cases where we naively expect it. As Taylor observes (160-1), our (seemingly correct) responses to surprising discoveries of this kind vary: when we found that no one was in league with the devil, we judged that there were no witches, but when we found that what we had previously taken to be solid objects are in fact mostly empty space, we did not come to judge that nothing is solid. Taylor may be right that the way to resolve issues of this kind is not to ‘interrogate’ our ‘ideas and concepts’; the problem is that it is hard to see how Taylor’s Martian methodology could admit that there might be an issue here at all.


Chomsky, N. 2000. New Horizons in the Study of Language and Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.