Meaning, Expression, and Thought, Cambridge

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Davis, Wayne A., Meaning, Expression, and Thought, Cambridge, 2002, 654pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521555132.

Reviewed by A.P. Martinich , University of Texas, Austin


Davis’s project in this book is to give an ’expression theory of meaning,’ according to which “words are conventional signs of mental states, principally thoughts and ideas, and that meaning consists in their expression” (1). For Davis, a convention is “a regularity that is socially useful, self-perpetuating, and arbitrary” (206). He is inspired by David Lewis’s analysis except that Davis argues that conventions do not include an equilibrium condition and do not require mutual knowledge (225-8). The meaning of a word is determined by an idea, which is an object, but it is “unnecessary and inaccurate to refer to ideas … as meanings.” The “word ’red’ in English … does not mean the idea of red” (130). Meanings are no objects; they are properties of words (130-4, 556-7). Thus, Frege’s theory of Sinne is mistaken because it makes meanings objects. Davis holds an ideational but not a referential theory of meaning.

Since ideas are parts of thoughts, one naturally expects, and Davis provides, a “theory of thought” (1). Thoughts are robustly existent and not amenable to reduction to behavior or physical states. Thoughts are “structured events, a particular kind of mental representation,” of which ideas are parts (6, 59). Declarative thoughts are propositions, that is, thoughts expressed by declarative sentences (344-5). There are also interrogative thoughts, expressed by interrogative sentences, and presumably imperative thoughts expressed by imperative sentences. This linguistic-thought correlation is not one-one, however, because there are thoughts that exist in no language and synonymous sentences express the same one thought.

Davis accepts the existence of thoughts on the basis of introspection and their predictive value (5). He declares himself part of the semantic tradition of Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Hobbes, and Locke. This raises an obvious problem. The views of Hobbes and Locke, at least, are susceptible to arguments against the existence of private languages. The argument applies to theories like that of Locke, for whom the meaning of a word is an idea that is known only by the speaker. This has the immediate consequence that no one could ever know what anyone else meant. Also, Locke’s theory requires a comparison between the speaker’s ideas and the hearer’s ideas; but a comparison can be carried out only if one has access to both objects.

Davis gives what I think is a perfunctory and unacceptable answer to the private language argument (571-2). However, Davis’s view is not immediately as subject to this refutation because his ideas are not Lockean ideas but concepts, objects that need not be uniquely possessed. Concepts are event-types, not tokens. Nonetheless, his theory is in trouble because he seems to hold that people have no cognitive possession of these concepts. What each person possesses is the occurrence of a token of a concept. Concepts have properties in virtue of these individual events (see also 533). So it is not clear how anyone could know that they have the same concept as someone else. Davis thinks that this is known in virtue of “what we observe” about the behavior of people. But then this raises the question of whether the concepts themselves do any work. Although Davis devotes two hundred pages to saying what ideas are, he realizes that someone might still not be clear about what ideas consist of (518). To the question, “what can we say about the intrinsic nature of the basic or atomic ideas?,” Davis answers, “At present, nothing definite” (518; cf. 421). This is worrisome to many, but not to Davis. Thoughts certainly exist, because, as mentioned, they are introspectible, and they are explanatory. Whether Davis is ultimately right, he gives a powerful defense of them against such criticisms as that the use of thoughts leads to a regress or circularity (586-98). His defense against Quine’s arguments is not, I think, successful. He seems to think that it is the idea of synonymy (sameness-of-meaning) itself and not the questionableness of the idea of meaning that drives Quine’s skepticism.

Davis’s theory is Gricean, or, as he prefers, “neo-Gricean.” The key problem with Grice’s theory, Davis claims, is “its emphasis on audience-directed intentions” (7). He says that “Grice and his closest followers wrongly assumed … that meaning is the attempt to communicate” (7; see also 63, 67). It is not easy to decide whether Davis is right about this or not. I think he would be right if he restricted his claim in this way: Grice wrongly assumed that all speaker meaning is the attempt to communicate. Davis is right that some sayings are expressions of thoughts, not beliefs, and not attempts to induce beliefs or actions. However, I think that the basic cases of utterer’s meaning are parts of attempts to communicate, instances of communication that do not rely on convention or rule-governed utterances. I think the cases of talking to babies and animals and other noncommunicative instances of meaning something are etiolated cases and should not be handled by the central part of a theory of meaning. In contrast, Davis thinks these cases are on all fours with the basic cases and wants the same analysis to handle them. What a theorist does may be more a matter of decision than good practice. It depends on when and where a philosopher likes or prefers to start pushing, stretching, and cutting the linguistic phenomena.

Sometimes this leads to apparently startling claims. For example, he says that a person “may communicate something to A without even trying to” (89); but with more explanation, it becomes hardly startling at all. He distinguishes communicating with (which does require trying) from communicating to (which does not). Something important underlies this procedure. Davis takes cases and uses of words that other philosophers would consider derivative or figurative, respectively, as on all fours with paradigmatic cases. For example, Searle holds that (paradigmatic) promising requires (1) that the addressee wants the speaker to do what the speaker promises to do and (2) that promises must be about a future action. Davis, I suspect, would deny (1) and (2) on the grounds that one might say, “I promise to ruin you” and “I promise that he was there.” This methodological difference results in substantially different analyses of important concepts such as communicating, meaning, and saying.

Like most philosophers, Davis studies the philosophy of language because he is at least as interested in the nature of thought and other mental phenomena. Although “thought” and “idea” are mentioned only in the titles of the latter two of the four parts of his book, discussions of thoughts and idea pervade the first two parts: (1) Semantic Acts and Intentions, (2) Languages and Semantics Acts, (3) Thoughts and Ideas, and (4) Ideational Theories of Meaning.

Davis seems to me to make some unfortunate choices in his technical terminology. For example, he defines “S expresses the belief that p” as “S either means [says] or implies that p,” even though it seems that what is implied is implicit and hence not expressed (cf. 59). His use of quotation marks is also unfortunate. He uses them both to mention words and sentences, to indicate the meanings of words and sentences (not to mention as corner quotes), thoughts and the contents of thoughts. This has the consequence that his sentence,

(A) The meaning of “bachelor” is “unmarried adult male”

is ambiguous between

The meaning of “bachelor” is (the same as the meaning of the phrase) “unmarried adult male.”


The meaning of “bachelor” is unmarried adult male.

And one encounters sentences like, “One expression meaning ’the idea “water”’ is obviously ’the idea “water”’“ (559). Davis in effect uses quotation marks in the same way that Russell did in “On Denoting” and that led to some of the confusions of his notorious Grey’s Elegy argument. Davis’s convention is surprising because there were so many other obvious ones that would have obviated the problem. He could have used single quotation marks or italics to denote meanings following formulas of the form, “w means.” This would have followed the convention of many philosophers who use italics to show that words are denoting thoughts.

Concerning the foundations of meaning, Davis distinguishes three kinds of meaning that are apparently relevant to semantics:

(1)Boulders mean glacial activity (Evidential Meaning).
(2) “Boulder” means “large rounded stone block.” (Word Meaning)
(3) By “boulder,” S means “kilo of cocaine.” (Speaker Meaning) (19)

Philosophers seem to disagree about “means” in (1). Some, like Davis, think that boulders merely give one good reason to think that there was glacial activity in the area. Others, like Grice and I, think that some kind of necessitation holds between the subject and direct object. If (1) is true, then it must be the case that there was glacial activity in the location of the boulders; but evidence does not induce necessity. If boulders were brought to the site by a truck dumping waste, then (1) is false even though the boulders remain the evidence that justified the assertion of (1) and the statement, “The boulders are the evidence for glacial activity” is true (cf. 45). A different example may make this clearer. Suppose the police catch Jones holding a bloody knife and standing over Smith’s bleeding body. The evidence remains evidence even if Jones is innocent of the stabbing and acquitted. Evidence points to a state of affairs but does not guarantee that it is a fact. Contrarily, “Those spots mean measles” is false if it turns out that the spotted person does not have measles. Davis is wrong to say that Grice’s “natural meaning” is evidential meaning. For Grice, if “means” has the sense of natural meaning, then “x means that p” entails that p.

Concerning (3), Davis does not distinguish between speakers and utterers. For Grice, speaker-meaning depends in part on word meaning, which depends on utterers’ meaning. What a speaker says depends on the meaning of his words, to which the speaker defers; but what an utterer means does not necessarily depend on the meanings of words since utterer’s meaning does not require the existence of language (cf. 38-9, 231). Davis’s use of “speaker meaning” also causes a possible confusion. He holds that word meaning depends on speaker meaning, and speaker meaning is “more fundamental” than word meaning (21). However, he also holds that “word meaning does not depend on speaker meaning” (268), and “Speaker meaning and word meaning are logically independent” (168). What he means is that word meaning does not depend on “any particular speaker’s intentions [meaning], but rather on conventional usage and the rules of language, which are determined by the intentions of prior speakers of the language (25, 44). But he could have made this clearer with some changes in terminology. A clearer terminology would also have obviated some mistakes, I think: for example, his criticism of Searle’s famous example of the American soldier with little knowledge of German (54).

Crucial to Davis’s theory is the difference between expressing a thought without committing oneself to its truth, as when one supposes something for a proof or contributes to a brainstorming session, and expressing a belief. It is the difference between thinking a thought or proposition and believing it. He indicates the difference as follows:

(4) By (the expression) e, S meant “p.” (Cogitative Speaker Meaning)
(5) By (saying or doing) e, S meant that p. (Cognitive Speaker Meaning)

(Again, I don’t think Davis’s use of quotation marks is suggestive.) This distinction is important, but occasionally he tries to have it do too much. For example, he thinks that fiction characteristically uses only cogitative meaning (27, 82, 190). But that is not right because either authors or narrators often express cognitive speaker meaning (“I swear the story I will tell you is true in all of its particulars”).

Although one of the two key concepts in his book is that of thought, I think Davis does not explain it as clearly as he might have. For example, analogous to beliefs, two aspects of thought need to be distinguished: there is the propositional attitude and the content of the propositional attitude. He might have reserved the word “thinking” (and “believing”) for the propositional attitude, and “thought” (and “belief”) for the content. But he uses “thought” for both. I also think it is wrong or at least odd to hold that propositions are event-types. That snow is white is a proposition, but it is not an event, because events involve changes. Perhaps Davis thinks that propositions are event-types because he thinks of their tokens as the events of thinking of a proposition; but this would involve a confusion of the content of the thought with the process of thinking it.

Since metaphysics is once again in full bloom, most readers will not be disconcerted to distinguish thoughts from the contents of thoughts, not to mention the objects of thoughts. To me it is Scotistic; and I’m not convinced that language or cognition requires such an elaborate metaphysical bureaucracy, as Davis develops. Some of the concepts seem to do no work: “the content of the thought that the sky is blue is that the sky is blue” (478).

In a book as long as Davis’s, it would have been easy for the reader to forget what has gone before or to be unable to dip into just those parts of the book that are of particular interest, if Davis had not been so careful at various points to give the reader clear, summaries of what he had already discussed.

Davis’s command of the scholarly literature is impressive. Not only is his bibliography almost 40 pages of small type, he often gives a brief history of the scholarly work on a topic by listing chronologically at appropriate places in the exposition the major treatments of that topic, sometimes one hundred items or so. Although no one can now read everything that is published on the philosophy of language, Davis’s reading is prodigious and admirable. His knowledge is also not restricted to the last one hundred years. He often brings in the views of Aristotle, Ockham, Hobbes, Leibniz, and others, and not in a heavy-handed or gratuitous way. Also, his topics range so broadly that they include discussions of Esperanto and American Sign Language as part of his clarification of such concepts as natural languages, living languages, dead languages, and even still born languages (267-72).

Davis’s writing is generally clear and each page is chock full of arguments for his view, most of which seem to me to be right or very close to right. If my review is largely critical and filled with reservations, it is only because Davis’s book is so rich in controversial material.