Meaning in Life

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Thaddeus Metz, Meaning in Life, Oxford University Press, 2013, 269pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199599318.

Reviewed by Stewart Goetz, Ursinus College


Within approximately the last fifteen years, there has been a resurgence of interest among professional philosophers in the meaning of life. No one has done more to contribute to the growing body of literature on the topic than Thaddeus Metz. His new book is an important, deeply engaging, and first-rate contribution to the literature on the meaning of life.

Metz develops a realist theory of meaning in life that he believes “provides a convincing explanation of . . . the many particular ways in which life can be meaningful” (7). Metz assumes that meaningfulness is a feature of a person’s life, as opposed to something like the cosmos (3), can be exhibited by an individual’s life in part or as a whole (4), comes in degrees (4), and is desirable because it is finally (intrinsically) valuable in itself (4). Just as it is not a logical contradiction to speak of a life as immoral and meaningful, so also it is not a logical contradiction to affirm either that a life is unhappy and meaningful or happy and meaningless (5). Meaninglessness should not be confused with absurdity (which is the idea of incongruity) or futility (which is the idea of repeated failure to achieve one’s ends) (6). Thus, a meaningful life could be absurd and futile.

A theory of meaningfulness that is off the table from the get-go is a hedonistic one, which maintains that meaningfulness is experiencing happiness/pleasure, where pleasure is a positive, intrinsically good experience whose continuance “it is invariably appropriate for you (pro tanto) to desire” (69). While “there is good reason to identify a pleasant life as a happy one” (60), “to enquire into meaningfulness is by definition not to enquire into a certain subjective conception of happiness” (27). Thus, “it is logically contradictory to think that one’s pleasure in itself, the mere experience, is meaningful” (27); “talk of ‘meaning’ a priori rules out a hedonist theory of it” (62).

With a hedonist conception of a meaningful life excluded by definition, Metz carefully examines three broad theoretical perspectives in Anglo-American philosophical literature on meaning in life: (a) supernaturalism, which maintains that “one’s existence is significant just insofar as one has a certain relation with some spiritual realm” (19); (b) subjective naturalism, which holds that “meaningfulness for a given person is entirely a function of that towards which she has a certain ‘pro-attitude’, e.g., wanting something and getting it, or setting something as an end and achieving it” (19); and © objective naturalism, which claims that “there are particular ways of being and behaving in the physical world that constitute a significant existence apart from being the object of anyone’s pro-attitude” (20).

One version of supernaturalism is the purpose theory. According to it, one’s life is more meaningful the better one fulfills a purpose that God has assigned to one (80). This account of what could make a life meaningful is prima facie attractive because it makes clear what it would mean for a life to have a point. And it also “jibes with the fact that talk of ‘purpose’ is closely associated with that of ‘meaning’” (82). Metz discusses how philosophers have claimed that the idea of God’s assigning us a purpose either exploits, coerces, or degrades us (99-104) and responds that “there is nothing inherently disrespectful about God’s assigning us a purpose and hence that purpose theory need not absurdly entail that God is immoral” (100). At issue is what God’s purpose for us is (104). If it is that we serve as food for intergalactic travelers, then the purpose theory is in trouble. However, if the purpose theorist maintains that God could offer us “the reward of eternal bliss for [freely] acting according to His [reasonable] will” (101), then it is hard to see how this purpose would be disrespectful of us. And the fact that freely choosing to act according to His will involves libertarian freedom and the possibility of frustrating God’s purpose for us does not undermine God’s omnipotence (104-05).

What, then, is the problem with the purpose theory? Metz believes it is the fact that the best explanation of the need for a relationship with God to make life meaningful requires that God uniquely have the properties of being atemporal, simple, immutable, and infinite, which supposedly confer incomparable value on our lives (106-08). At the heart of this problem for the purpose theory is the difficulty in understanding how a God who is outside time and unchangeable could choose to create us. Creation is an activity, and an activity is an event that involves temporal change (113). Metz believes this problem is sufficient to undermine the truth of the purpose theory.

According to Metz, supernaturalism, of which the purpose theory is a species, is motivated by a perfection thesis, which holds that meaning in life requires engagement with a maximally conceived value (e.g., God as the most perfect being). As a naturalist, Metz defends an imperfection thesis according to which life on balance can be meaningful (and we all know meaningfulness exists in life (158-59)) without engaging with some maximal or perfect value (11, 140). Hence when thinking and forming judgments about meaning in life, not only is God essentially irrelevant but so also is comparison with a superman or members of some superspecies. In other words, one should not conclude that one’s earthly life is not meaningful because it does not measure up to the life had by some being on another planet (158). Meaningfulness in life exists and is natural in the sense that it is constituted by physical properties of substances located in space and time and involves actively living in certain ways (159-60, 163, 164, 220).

What kind of naturalist theory of meaningfulness does Metz endorse? He objects to subjectivism (subjective naturalism), because it entails both that “Sisyphus’s life could be meaningful merely for having fulfilled a desire to roll a stone” and that doing nothing but “collecting bottle caps” could make for a meaningful life (175). Given these “seriously counterintuitive implications” (175) and the fact that any attempt to remove them leads to the objection resurfacing in “‘Whac-a-mole’ fashion” (179), Metz advocates an objectivist theory of meaning (objective naturalism), according to which “certain states of affairs in the physical world are meaningful ‘in themselves’, apart from being the object of propositional attitudes” (165). What are these states of affairs that are meaningful in themselves? Intuitively, they are active uses of reason about the following fundamental values: the good, the true, and the beautiful (222). To capture this intuition, Metz proposes what he terms “the fundamentality theory” (Chapter 12). According to it, meaningfulness in life comes from actively orienting one’s rational nature, which in the first instance involves cognition and intentional action, but extends to rationally responsive conation (e.g., desire), emotion (e.g., feeling joy upon awareness of a loved one’s success), and affection (e.g., liking a work of art), toward the good, the true, and the beautiful as they pertain to persons individually and collectively and the environment (226).

Consider fundamentality vis-à-vis the good. The best example of meaningfulness here is outstanding moral achievement as exemplified by the likes of Nelson Mandela and Mother Teresa. They rationally actively bettered the fundamental conditions of people by freeing them from discrimination, tyranny, disease, hunger, etc., where this freedom made it possible for them to live more rational and, thereby, meaningful lives (227). Einstein and Darwin exemplified fundamentality with respect to the true by actively orienting their attention toward basic facets of human nature such as space-time, energy, atomic structure, natural selection, socialization, communication, and power (229). Knowledge of these fundamental facets and others like them contributes to the meaningfulness of life for both the knower and those whose lives they intentionally make more meaningful by improving their knowledge of the truth (229-30). Fundamentality with respect to the beautiful involves an active use of reason in forms like literature and art “about topics such as morality, war, death, love, family, and the like” (230), which are fundamental to explaining much about human life.

Metz believes an important feature of his objective naturalist view of meaning in life is its inclusion of the idea that having less meaning can be more than the mere absence of meaning. There are “conditions of life that reduce its meaning beyond merely failing to enhance it” (220), where these conditions are analogous to the disvalue of pain (pain is more than the mere absence of pleasure). Metz terms these conditions “anti-matter” (63-64). Given the reality of anti-matter,

the following actions and attitudes would subtract from the overall meaning of a life, beyond merely failing to enhance its meaning: blowing up the Sphinx; spreading nuclear waste; holding sexist and racist beliefs and emotions; hating others by, say, viewing them largely in terms of their weaknesses; torturing others for fun. (234)

In sum,

[a] human person’s life is more meaningful, the more that she, without violating certain moral constraints against degrading sacrifice, employs her reason and in ways that either positively orient rationality towards fundamental conditions of human existence, or negatively orient it towards what threatens them, such that the worse parts of her life cause better parts towards its end by a process that makes for a compelling and ideally original life-story; in addition, the meaning in a human person’s life is reduced, the more it is negatively oriented towards fundamental conditions of human existence or exhibits narrative disvalue. (235)

Metz’s view of the meaning of life is both sophisticated and thought provoking. What might one say in response to it? As someone who is attracted to a hedonist conception of meaningfulness, where pleasure is “meaningful” in the sense that it is “that which makes life worth living,” I have the following thoughts. While Metz concedes that his claim that “‘meaning’ a priori rules out a hedonist theory” is a strong one (62), he argues that it is supported by the thought that if “pleasure” and “meaning” did not connote different things “it would be logically contradictory to speak of an ‘unpleasant but meaningful life’ or a ‘pleasant but meaningless life’” (61). But, he insists, it isn’t logically contradictory. I agree that it isn’t, if we understand meaningfulness here instrumentally. Just prior to making his point about what “pleasure” and “meaning” connote, Metz tells us that there are “meaningful activities such as helping others and creating artwork” (61), where this meaningfulness is an intrinsic or final good (Metz uses the terms interchangeably (48, footnote 7; 62)). In light of Metz’s acknowledgement that “some sources of meaning are extrinsic (e.g., can be the . . . results of a person’s action)” (73), a hedonist about meaningfulness can plausibly respond that the meaningfulness of these activities is not intrinsic to them but extrinsic in virtue of their leading to experiences of pleasure in others (and the agent). Moreover, if “meaningfulness” refers to an intrinsic good insofar as it means “that which ultimately makes life worth living,” then, assuming for the sake of discussion that pleasure alone ultimately makes life worth living and pain alone ultimately makes it not worth living (because it is intrinsically evil), and there are lives composed only of pleasure or only of pain, it is logically contradictory to speak of a pleasant but meaningless life and an unpleasant but meaningful life.

Metz might respond that it is implausible to understand “meaningful” as “that which makes life worth living.” But it is intuitively reasonable to think that someone who is concerned about the meaning of life is concerned about whether there is anything that makes life worth living. However, it is equally intuitively reasonable to hold that this is not the only thing a person is concerned with when thinking about the meaning of life. It is also plausible to maintain that an individual is interested in whether things ultimately make sense. Metz recognizes this sense of “meaningfulness”:

Think, too, about the theory that a person’s life is meaningful insofar as she is justly rewarded, perhaps in an afterlife, for having performed right actions and exhibited an upright character. To some, life would make sense only if happiness were ultimately proportioned to morality; it would be meaningless for the wicked to prosper and the upright to suffer. (33)

 As I have already pointed out, Metz recognizes the centrality of the idea of purpose when thinking about meaning in life: “Now, when we are asking whether our life is meaningful, we are often asking whether it has a point and whether it makes sense” (115). Why, then, could not concern about meaningfulness be a concern about this cluster of issues: what makes life worth living; what is the purpose of life; and what is needed for things ultimately to make sense? There certainly seems to be a rational connection between them, what one might even think of as a family resemblance, which is a notion to which Metz is attracted (34-35).

However, I will concede for the sake of discussion that pleasure/happiness and meaningfulness “are conceptually and substantially distinct [values]” (73). Though distinct, Metz tells us that both are worthwhile (make life worth living) (59), and presumably the best life would include both (Metz says that the “best life” would include bodily pleasures (61). He also tells us that causal relationships obtain between the two. “For instance, in order to obtain meaning in life, one often must have a certain degree of pleasure . . . . but a lack of meaning can also impede pleasure; for one could become depressed in the first place from a failure to detect meaning in one’s life” (62). And recall that Metz holds that having less meaning is more than the mere absence of meaning and the introduction of “conditions of life that reduce its meaning beyond merely failing to enhance it” (220). What, now, about a situation in which one could be happier by having less meaning in one’s life? What if I could live a long, good life in terms of my happiness by employing Stalinist tactics (e.g., killing innocents, torturing humans)? Given that (i) my own happiness is an objective, final good and, therefore, something it is reasonable for me to be concerned about and (ii) that I live in a naturalistic world where death is my final end, why should I sacrifice my happiness for the final good of meaningfulness in my life, when this life is the only one I have in which to be as happy as I can be? Does one final value, happiness or meaningfulness, necessarily trump the other in terms of reasonableness? It is not open to Metz to respond that this problem cannot arise because meaningfulness cannot conflict with happiness in the way that I have suggested. Given that he concedes that there is justification for thinking the hedonist theory about happiness is correct (“there is good reason to identify a pleasant life as a happy one” (60)), the potential for conflict is real.

At the end of the book, Metz writes “I still crave immortality,” which he suspects “is a function of our tendency to idealize” (247). He adds that “there are some who argue that wishing is rational, in the sense that it ought to cohere tightly with our judgements” (247). But, alas, “a wish is just a wish” (248). Perhaps. But if the problem of making sense out of the relationship between happiness and meaningfulness that I have raised for Metz’s objective naturalist view is a real one, as I suspect it is, things are ultimately rationally absurd because they don’t make sense/fit together in the right way. And this deep source of meaninglessness makes wishing for things to make sense at least appear quite rational. In the end, what is deeply disconcerting about objective naturalism is that it cannot guarantee the kind of rational narrative about our lives that we deeply desire.


Thanks to Timothy Mawson and Joshua Seachris for helpful input with this review.