Meaning, Mind, & Matter: Philosophical Essays

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Ernie Lepore and Barry Loewer, Meaning, Mind, & Matter: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2011, 238pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199580781.

Reviewed by Claire Horisk, University of Missouri


This useful collection brings together fourteen previously published essays. Eight of the papers are co-authored by Lepore and Loewer, three are by Lepore alone, and three by Loewer alone. The essays have more thematic unity than it might seem from the collection's title. Lepore and Loewer, together and separately, explore and develop a broadly Davidsonian program, with a particular focus on Davidson's theories about meaning and about the mind. Davidson was an imaginative and brilliant thinker, but his writing is sometimes inaccessible; Lepore and Loewer remedy this deficiency. Ten of the fourteen essays here are drawn from the heyday of their collaboration in the 1980s, during which they explained, defended, criticized, and refined the Davidsonian grand plan. Of course Lepore and Loewer are not the only ones who have opened up Davidsonian ideas to us all; there is Mark Platts's Ways of Meaning (1997), for example, which was first published in 1979, and more recently Lepore and Ludwig's (2005) and (2007) volumes about Davidson. But the influence that Davidson has had on analytic philosophy is at least in part due to the clarity and scope of these essays by Lepore and Loewer.

The first five papers in the volume argue that Davidson's truth-conditional semantics can do something that a range of competing semantic theories cannot.[1] Some of these competitors are no longer widely discussed. But the interest of these papers does not lie in the defeat of these competitors, but in how Lepore and Loewer argue for truth-conditional semantics. The main theme, pressed again and again in these papers, is that it can explain "one central ability: the ability to acquire justifiable beliefs about the world and about each other's beliefs through our linguistic practices" (p. 69). A core example involves Cinderella and Barbarella listening to Arabella, a German speaker who is looking out the window, and who says 'Es schneit'. Both Cinderella and Barbarella may grasp that Arabella believes that 'Es schneit' is true. But if Barbarella understands German and Cinderella does not, Barbarella may also acquire the justified beliefs that it is snowing and that Arabella believes that it is snowing. What justifies the first of these beliefs, Lepore and Loewer argue, is that Barbarella knows that 'Es schneit' is true in German if and only if it is snowing; what justifies the second is that she has reason to believe that Arabella believes 'Es schneit' is true in German if and only if it snowing (p. 70). Thus Barbarella's ability to acquire these beliefs is explained by her knowledge of the truth-conditions of 'Es schneit'. The truth-conditional approach, Lepore and Loewer argue, both specifies what is known by someone who understands a language and specifies what must hold for a sentence to be true (p. 71). What makes Lepore and Loewer's defense of truth-conditional semantics distinctive is their emphasis on its epistemic role; they press the point that understanding a language consists in knowledge like Barbarella's, which puts her "in a position to draw conclusions both about the world and about what other speakers have in mind" (p. 71).

Lepore and Loewer's emphasis on the epistemic merits of the Davidsonian approach to meaning remains a persistent theme in the middle third of the volume. Lepore and Loewer in "You Can SayThat Again" and Lepore in "Conditions on Understanding Language" draw together Davidson's truth-conditional semantics with his paratactic account of indirect discourse. Davidson intended his account of indirect discourse to solve the problem of substitutivity while, unlike Frege, allowing linguistic expressions to have the same meaning in both opaque and transparent contexts. A key notion in the account is that of samesaying: I samesay Galileo "by using words the same in import here and now as his then and there" (Davidson, 1984, p. 104). Here, Lepore and Loewer argue that the paratactic account can justify an inference from a premise about what sentence someone assertively utters to a conclusion about what she said; e.g., from the premise that Andrea assertively uttered 'Il gatto siede dietro al forno' to the conclusion that Andrea said that the cat sits behind the oven. As before, then, Lepore and Loewer emphasize the epistemological aspect of understanding a language and defend Davidson on the grounds that his account can explain how we acquire justified beliefs, in this case, beliefs about what a speaker has said.

The paratactic account has many critics, but here Lepore and Loewer mount a creative defense of it and also argue that it provides a valuable solution to two related problems faced by truth-conditional semantics. One of these is that if a meaning theory for L allows the derivation of

(1) 'water is wet' is true in L if and only if water is wet,

it also allows the derivation of the extensionally equivalent

(2) 'water is wet' is true in L if and only if water is wet and grass is green or grass is not green.

But the latter T-sentence is not meaning-giving. The second problem is that a meaning theory for L must be constrained so that we cannot derive from its axioms T-sentences like this one:

(3) 'water is wet' is true if and only if H2O is wet,

which is extensionally equivalent to the meaning-giving (1), but unlike (1), does not 'give the meaning' of 'water is wet'. The solutions that Davidson proposed to these problems -- appealing first to the idea that the T-sentences must be law-like, and second to the idea that they must be empirically verifiable -- are generally agreed to be unsuccessful. However, Lepore and Loewer argue that the problems can be solved with the addition of the paratactic account: To understand a language it is not sufficient to know all the T-biconditionals entailed by an adequate theory, but it is sufficient to know (a) all the T-biconditionals entailed by the theory, and (b) for any two utterances of sentences of the language, whether or not they samesay each other. This latter piece of knowledge will rule out T-sentences that are extensionally adequate but not meaning-giving. Lepore and Loewer's proposal is intriguing but has not gained much traction in the literature as a whole since its first publication.  A more widely touted solution to these problems is the idea that the derivation rules for a truth theory for L must be restricted so that they do not permit the derivation of aberrant T-sentences.[2] These papers show very clearly how Lepore and Loewer depart from Davidson, while still defending the broad outlines of his program.

The final essays in the volume turn away from philosophy of language to metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. They return to Davidsonian themes with a defense of his anomalous monism in "Mind Matters," and touch on metaphysical realism in "A Putnam's Progress," but the primary concern of these essays is to formulate and defend a physicalist view on which mental properties are not reducible to physical properties, and on which there is mental causation.

Concision is valuable, but the material written especially for this volume is too short. The introduction asks a tantalizing question -- "what if anything has changed in our minds since these collaborations in the 1980s?" -- but gives only a brief answer, noting that Lepore no longer endorses the paratactic solution to the pair of problems discussed above, and conceding a little ground to objections posed by Fodor and Schiffer (p. 4). It would have been nice to see more reflection on the challenges to Lepore and Loewer's views posed by contemporary critics of truth-theoretic semantics. For example, a core claim that Davidson makes in support of truth-conditional semantics is that it can explain compositionality. But more recently, Paul Pietroski (2003) has argued that truth-conditional semantics cannot explain compositionality. Judgments about truth values are affected by a host of non-semantic factors, and the truth conditions of sentences of natural languages such as English are not compositionally determined. So if a meaning theory must be compositional (and Pietroski agrees that it must), then a truth-conditional semantics is not a meaning theory. Is Lepore and Loewer's faith in truth-theoretic semantics shaken by arguments like Pietroski's? The introduction does not tell us.

Even closer to home, the introduction mentions the work of Cappelen and Lepore, but does not grapple with the issue of whether Cappelen and Lepore see eye-to-eye with Lepore and Loewer. Cappelen and Lepore (2005) defend speech act pluralism, a view on which many things are said or meant by any utterance. Is speech act pluralism really compatible with Lepore and Loewer's marriage of truth-conditional semantics and the paratactic theory of indirect discourse? If the paratactic theory is to explain the inference from the premise that Andrea assertively uttered 'Il gatto siede dietro al forno' to the conclusion that Andrea said that the cat sits behind the oven, it seems samesaying must hew closely to semantic content. But if Cappelen and Lepore are correct, two utterances might say the same thing as each other while having quite different semantic content. Perhaps saying the same thing falls short of samesaying, but we would need an argument to show that the views are consistent, and that argument is not given here. More seriously, one might wonder whether Cappelen and Lepore's speech act pluralism can be squared with Davidson's radical interpretation, but there is no discussion of this question. A more substantial introduction, or a closing essay assessing Lepore and Loewer's earlier views in light of recent developments, would have been a valuable addition to this collection.

In the age of JSTOR, one might question the value of collections of reprinted essays. Quite a few of the papers in this volume were first published in well-known journals (among them The Journal of PhilosophyMidwest Studies in Philosophy, and the Canadian Journal of Philosophy), and anyone with access to an adequately-funded university library can get them easily. Furthermore, it is a weakness of the collection that it does not include the most difficult to find of Lepore and Loewer's oeuvre, the 1989 paper "Absolute Truth Theories for Modal Languages as Theories of Interpretation," published in Crítica. But nevertheless, the collection has real merits. Lepore and Loewer's work is a must-read for people who are working on Davidsonian semantics, and this collection brings it together. The book is an excellent resource for someone who wants a grasp of the central objections to Davidson's program that emerged in the twentieth century and the main lines of reply. It also brings to light the extent of Lepore and Loewer's collaboration. Many of the papers were published when Lepore was known as Le Pore, and a search on the Philosopher's Index for Lepore and Loewer as authors identifies only a fifth of their joint output; so even the papers that were first published in readily accessible journals can be hard to find. In short, the book unites a set of highly influential papers that did much to advance our understanding of the strengths and weaknesses of the Davidsonian program.[3]


Cappelen, Herman and Lepore, Ernie (2005), Insensitive Semantics: A Defense of Semantic Minimalism and Speech Act Pluralism (Oxford: Blackwell Publishing).

LePore, Ernest and Loewer, Barry (1989), 'Absolute Truth Theories for Modal Languages as Theories of Interpretation', Crítica: Revista Hispanoamericana de Filosofía, 21, 43-73.

Lepore, Ernest and Ludwig, Kirk (2005), Donald Davidson: Meaning, Truth, Language and Reality (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Lepore, Ernest and Ludwig, Kirk (2007), Donald Davidson's Truth Theoretic Semantics (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Pietroski, Paul (2003), 'The Character of Natural Language Semantics.', in Alex Barber (ed.), Epistemology of Language (Oxford: Oxford University Press).

Platts, Mark (1997), Ways of Meaning (2nd ed.; Cambridge, MA: MIT Press).

[1] These papers are Lepore's "Translational Semantics" and "What Model-Theoretic Semantics Cannot Do", Loewer's "The Role of 'Conceptual Role Semantics'" and the co-authored "Three Trivial Truth Theories" and "Dual-Aspect Semantics."

[2] See Lepore and Ludwig (2005), for example.

[3] My thanks to Philip Robbins for helpful comments.