Meaning without Representation: Essays on Truth, Expression, Normativity, and Naturalism

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Steven Gross, Nicholas Tebben, and Michael Williams (eds.), Meaning without Representation: Essays on Truth, Expression, Normativity, and Naturalism, Oxford University Press, 2015, 379pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198722199.

Reviewed by Delia Belleri, University of Vienna


The essays contained in this collective volume all revolve around the question of whether the function of language is to represent the world. There is more than one interpretation of this question, as Nicholas Tebben rightly observes in the Introduction (p. 6). Still, it seems possible to gather the contributions under three main headings. The first has to do with truth deflationism and the idea that being true is not connected with metaphysically loaded relations like "representing the world" or "corresponding to the facts". The second has to do with semantic expressivism and the thesis that language does not serve to represent the world but rather to express certain mental states, either locally (e.g. in the ethics discourse) or globally. The third has to do with the foundational question of whether meaning-facts can be naturalized or not.

The volume presents seventeen essays (including the Introduction), some of them from unquestionably leading authors in the relevant debates (Allan Gibbard, Paul Boghossian, and Paul Horwich, to name but three), and all from highly renowned experts in the field. The book therefore represents a remarkably valuable, up-to-date resource for the specialized reader interested in issues spanning deflationism, pragmatism, and pluralism about truth, global and local forms of expressivism, meaning naturalism, and the Kripkenstein paradox, as well as the multiple interconnections between these themes and their links to foundational and methodological questions such as the status of metaphysics, the role of naturalism in philosophy, the theoretical implications of rethinking truth, meaning, and reference.

This is deep, dense, fascinating philosophy, indeed some of the best philosophy one could happen to read nowadays. My aim in this review is quite modest: provide a summary of the contributed essays that is as informative as possible for the prospective reader, leaving my critical assessment of their contents aside. I have organized the summaries according to their subject: truth deflationism, expressivism, and foundational issues; sub-sections specify which aspects of the main themes are explored. I will deviate a little from the division proposed by the editors in trying to shed light on a number of internal links between the different chapters.

Truth Deflationism: New Proposals and Developments

Rebecca Kukla and Eric Winsberg advocate a "Strict Deflationism" about truth in "Deflationism, Pragmatism, and Metaphysics". The view maintains that: (i) "true" functions as a logical constant, defined in terms of an Introduction rule (S entails that "S" is true) and an Elimination rule (That "S" is true entails S); (ii) bi-conditionals like " 'Snow is white' is true iff snow is white" are trivial consequences of the above-stated rules and merely illustrate the formal, notational role that "true" plays in order for it to serve a number of logical functions. Kukla and Winsberg compare their Strict Deflationism to other brands of deflationism that purport to explain the meaning of "true" by using a pragmatic story: for instance, Grover et al.'s account to the effect that " 'S'is true" expresses a prosentence, i.e. a device of citation of the asserted sentence and endorsement if it. The authors argue that such an account is still too inflationist if one interprets it as offering a theory of truth in pragmatic terms; by contrast, if the truth-theory is kept purely disquotational, pragmatic phenomena can be unproblematically acknowledged and analysed in a distinct fashion.

In "Does the Expressive Role of 'True' Preclude Deflationary Davidsonian Semantics?", Steven Gross asks whether Davidsonian semantics can be made deflationary, that is, whether it can be combined with the view that truth has no explanatory role, but merely serves to specify the truth-conditions of sentences through biconditionals like "S is true in L iff p". Gross counters Claire Horisk's (2007) argument that at least three deflationary theories (set forth by Quine, Horwich, and Brandom) do not live up to the following requirements imposed by a Davidsonian account: first, "S is true" on the left-hand side of the biconditional must refer to a sentence; and second, the sentence must be picked out by its syntactic and not semantic properties. Gross defends all these authors from Horisk's critique, showing that they do meet the above-mentioned requirements and thus opens up promising avenues for a deflation of Davidsonian semantics.

The relation between semantic expressivism and truth deflationism is the topic of Mark Schroeder's article "Hard Cases for Combining Expressivism and Deflationist Truth". Schroeder first holds that it is possible to work out what I believe it would be appropriate to call an "Expressivist Deflationism" about truth. Schroeder formulates truth deflationism as the conjunction of two theses: (i) there is no nature of truth and (ii) all we need do in order to understand what "true" means is explain how its meaning guarantees that no instance of the following schema can be denied: "If S is that P, then S is true just in case P" (for instance: "If what Jane says is that snow is white, then what Jane says is true just in case snow is white"). The explanation required in (ii) is then given in expressivist terms: no instance of the schema can be denied because if it were, then contradictions would derive from our use of "true" insofar as this word allows us to express agreement and disagreement. The second task for Schroeder is to deal with an objection against his view stemming from expressivist accounts for epistemic modals and indicative conditionals. For Schroeder, the objection represents a chance to refine his view's ontological commitments concerning propositions.

From deflationary theories of truth we move to a deflationary proposal about reference. Alexis Burgess ("An Inferentialist Account of Referential Success") puts forward a "conceptually frugal" account of referential success within an inferentialist framework narrowly construed (i.e., where nothing is said about word/world relations). In his view, the concept of singular reference is determined by the following introduction and elimination rules: (In) If a term t figures in a simple atomic truth, then t refers; (Out) If t refers to something, then t could have figured in a simple atomic truth. Here are some notable features of Burgess' account. First, the reference of a term depends on the term occurring (or being able to occur) in a true sentence rather than on the existence of its putative referent. Second, a term has to occur in an atomic sentence, that is, it has to be concatenated with a simple predicate. Third, the consequent of (Out) has a modal construction in order to be compatible with context-sensitivity.

Truth Deflationism: Critics and Opponents

A defence of correspondence theory is undertaken by Michael Glanzberg in his "Representation and the Modern Correspondence Theory of Truth". He starts out by characterizing what he dubs the Modern correspondence theory of truth: this is formulated along Tarskian lines, stating that a sentence Pa is true iff the object to which a refers satisfies P, and it is supplemented by the requirement (previously posed by Field, 1972) that we have some causal picture of the word-to-world relations of reference and satisfaction. In contrast to what Glanzberg calls the Traditional correspondence theory, the Modern version does not presuppose the existence of structured facts and does not presuppose any structural correspondence between sentences and facts. He defends the view against two main objections: the first is that, if all the theory offers is a semantic story featuring reference, satisfaction, and composition, this is not a substantial theory of truth. The second objection asks whether a semantic characterization captures the nature of truth. Glanzberg's conclusion is that the Modern correspondence theory merely offers an "implicit" characterization of truth: the best we can do, he states, is construct semantic systems in which we can see the features of truth in action.

In "Deflationism, Truth and Accuracy", Dean Pettit challenges deflationism by arguing that it is incompatible with a deflation of the notion of accuracy. As he explains, truth is a sub-case of accuracy: while truth is a property of propositional representations, accuracy is a property that can also be ascribed to non-propositional representations, such as pictures, gauges, or maps. Pettit observes that what renders a position genuinely deflationist is its contention that there is no further metaphysics of truth to be uncovered. Horwich's minimalism is considered paradigmatic here. Pettit alleges that even if one were to succeed in giving a minimalist theory of accuracy, this would also seem to imply advancing an intuitively acceptable metaphysical view about the nature of accuracy, thus defeating the deflationary attempt. For instance, even if we were to explicate the accuracy of a (propositional or non-propositional) representation in terms of the schema <<p> is accurate iff p>, Pettit purports to show that any adequate explication will have to portray accuracy as involving a relationship between a representation and its representee, where this seems like a good candidate for a metaphysical account of the nature of accuracy.

Truth Deflationism and Pragmatism

Michael Patrick Lynch ("Pragmatism and the Price of Truth") proclaims himself sympathetic towards the pragmatist idea that truth is both (a) the norm of belief -- what makes a belief correct -- and (b) the goal of inquiry -- the aim we strive to achieve in engaging cognitively with the world. He defends thesis (a) from an attempt to deflate it by trying to derive it from the equivalence schema ("<p> is true iff p") plus the belief-related norm that it is correct to believe p iff p. Far from being deflatable, thesis (a) helps us understand the role of truth in our cognitive economy: it sets the conceptual priority of truth over justification, making truth the most fundamental norm of belief, and regulates our practices of belief acquisition. So far, the story is pretty much a pragmatist one, and indeed Lynch highlights the similarities between his and Price's approach. However, while Price rejects the idea that any metaphysical claim can be made about truth, and therefore endorses a quietist pragmatism, Lynch favours a more metaphysically laden development, whereby truth is a functional property described by a number of platitudes and realized by a variety of more specific properties, such as correspondence or warranted assertibility. This development goes in an anti-deflationist direction, but it is compatible with a naturalistic, respectable methodology in metaphysics.

Cheryl Misak's "Pragmatism and the Function of Truth" is a historically informed analysis of the many ways in which pragmatism about truth has been defended, from Peirce (1931), to Quine (e.g., 2008), to Rorty (e.g., 1986). Misak reconstructs Peirce's position as a form of disquotationalism, according to which there is nothing more to truth than "'p' is true iff p", which is, however, complemented by the thesis that when we assert that p is true, we are saying that p stands up and will continue to stand up to experience. Ramsey seems close to Peirce when he opposes the Jamesian equation between truth and usefulness, espouses the disquotational schema, and establishes a link between it and the principles that guide our action. Peirce and Ramsey are cited by Misak as examples of a sensible pragmatism, which neither restricts the range of truth so as to exclude normative discourse (Quine), nor combines disquotationalism with a thoroughgoing subjectivism about truth (Rorty).

Expressivism: New Proposals and Developments

Mark Richard outlines an expressivist semantics for moral sentences in "What Would an Expressivist Semantics Be?" Richard proposes that a moral sentence like "Hunting for sport is wrong" conventionally expresses a commitment to valuing hunting for sport in a certain way. Valuing certain actions is here understood in terms of them playing a certain motivational role in one's mental economy, given one's interests. Moreover, commitments have aptness conditions expressed in terms of <i, w> pairs, where i represents a set of interests and w represents the set of possible worlds compatible with i. "Hunting for sport is wrong" therefore expresses a commitment to de-valuing hunting, which is apt in all the possible worlds w where the subject's interests i disfavour hunting. What is crucial in Richard's proposal is that moral sentences are associated with commitments to attitudes, instead of attitudes tout court; that is because, in his view, commitments can be non-problematically closed under algebraic operators, while attitudes pose a number of difficulties. This feature is specifically argued to improve on Schroeder's (2008) expressivist semantics in terms of attitudes.

Dorit Bar-On explores and clarifies the notion of expression in "Expression: Act, Products, and Meaning". She distinguishes between action-expression (a-expression), which pertains to a subject's venting a mental state through action, and semantic-expression (s-expression), which is a linguistic string's encoding of a certain semantic content. Bar-On then puts this distinction to use in solving three puzzles. First is the puzzle of the origin of language. Here she holds that non-linguistic animal signaling, which could be regarded as mere a-expressions, really foreshadows semantic relations like that of reference or predication. Attending to these complexities helps us to see the link between a-expressions and the s-expressions that later emerge in human language. Second is the puzzle concerning the special epistemic security of first-person avowals like "I am feeling sad". Bar-On explains this epistemic security by regarding avowals as instances of a-expressions of the subject's mental state, which occur through the subject's use of a sentence that conventionally s-expresses a certain proposition. Third is the puzzle of the motivational character of ethical claims like "Stealing is wrong". Bar-On again explains this by contending that ethical claims regarded as acts a-express a motivational state, while ethical claims regarded as products can be identified with sentences that s-express a truth-evaluable content.

In "Global Expressivism and the Truth in Representation", Gibbard outlines and refines his expressivist position by comparing and contrasting it with Price's (2011, 2013) position. Price's picture countenances e-representation, corresponding to a word-to-world relation of tracking, and i-representation, which involves language-use according to various rules, but no tracking. Price regards these as two different typologies of representation that nevertheless fail to answer to a common representational genus. For this reason, Price identifies his position as a global expressivism. Gibbard shares the notions of e-representation and i-representation, but thinks they are differently related. E-representation provides the paradigm for representation. This notwithstanding, some portions of language may be viewed as i-representational, in that they retain the rules and patterns of usage of e-representational discourse, with no need for tracking. Gibbard's main aim in the second part of his essay is to make sense of reference within an i-representational framework. To this end, he appeals to the notion of co-reference. Two terms co-refer if, according to the rules of the language and to the conversational context, they can be inter-substituted within a number of sentences. Co-reference is a normative concept in that it has to do with which substitutions are permitted and which are not; also, the meaning of any word can be explained by stating the terms for which it can be substituted. If co-reference is normative and grounds the semantics of our terms in such a general way, then we have a form of global expressivism.

Expressivism: A Critical Perspective on the Normativity of Meaning

Anandi Hattiangadi's "The Limits of Expressivism" provides a critique of Gibbard's (2013) project to account for intentional concepts in normative terms. Hattiangadi summarizes Gibbard's position as follows: first, semantic concepts like MEANING, REFERENCE, and CONTENT are plan-laden. When a subject believes that E means x, she in the state of mind of accepting a certain plan as to the use of E. Second, precisely because these semantic concepts are normative, there is no need to explain them naturalistically; the only naturalistic explanation needed concerns what it takes for us to grasp concepts such as MEANING, REFERENCE, and CONTENT. Hattiangadi's first critique takes issue with the second thesis, urging that the fact that we need (and can give) a naturalistic explanation of what it is to "grasp the concepts" of meaning, etc. contradicts the contention that no naturalistic explanation is required for intentional concepts. This is because "grasping a concept" is itself an intentional concept. Hattiangadi's second critique builds on the implication that, in Gibbard's theory, meta-theoretical statements like "'Meaning' means x" are themselves to be understood as plan-laden, and hence as normative and expressivistic. This renders these meta-statements explanatorily spurious.

Dealing with the normativity of meaning also implies asking foundational questions about what normativity itself amounts to. Mark Lance's "Life is not a Box-Score: Lived Normativity, Abstract Evaluation and the Is/Ought Distinction", advocates the idea of "lived" or "embodied" normativity as a theoretical tool that can help to explain moral action, but also the normativity enshrined in a number of expressivist proposals concerning meaning. Standard accounts of morality distinguish between a normative and a descriptive dimension, where the normative is usually linked with motivation to act. Lance alleges that the normative as conceived in the standard picture is insufficient to explain motivation, because it represents one's commitments "from the outside". He then introduces the notion of "lived commitments", that is, commitments that are endorsed in a first-personal, conscious way that guide a person's life and reasoning. For instance, it is one thing for Joyce to be "externally" committed to taking care of her ageing father, where this does not imply that she will be motivated to do it; it is another thing for Joyce to have a "lived commitment" to do so, which directly accounts for her striving to live up to this commitment.

Foundational Issues: Naturalism in Semantics and Philosophy

In "Idling and Sidling Towards Philosophical Peace", Price presents a dilemma argument against McDowell's quietism. In various places (e.g., 1994 and 2009), McDowell seems to urge a rejection of naturalized metaphysics, where this leads to: (i) renouncing metaphysics altogether and (ii) assuming a quietist stance whereby no further interesting philosophical inquiry is possible. Price outlines two positions that closely resemble the one just sketched, and argues that McDowell seems to have no choice but to adopt one of the two, even though both are somehow at odds with his core commitments. The first position, which Price calls Sidling, consists in the recognition that, while there is an exclusive (perhaps purely stipulative) sense in which all facts are natural facts, there is also an inclusive sense in which e.g. ethical and generally value-related facts are facts. Framing fact-discourse in this way is compatible with a non-quietist view whereby philosophy is still in place as an anthropological inquiry into our linguistic practices. The second position, which Price dubs Idling, could be described as an across-the-board, though shallow and trivial realism. Price observes that McDowell should recoil from this alternative. However, since this cannot mean that he should adopt a substantive metaphysical stance, the only path left open is to treat metaphysical considerations as simply "language games". This, however, implies embracing the Sidling position, preventing him from being a quietist.

Boghossian, in "Is (Determinate) Meaning a Naturalistic Phenomenon?", deals with Kripke's (1982) argument against the existence of any fact of the matter regarding what we mean by certain terms. Boghossian points to some limitations of Kripke's argument, but aims to show that it could also be used to establish a conclusion weaker than the one its proponent had in mind: if it is naturalistic facts about our dispositions that determine what we mean by certain concepts (e.g. "plus"), then what we mean is indeterminate. "Determining" should here be understood as "providing an adequate supervenience base". Boghossian goes through a number of attempts to argue that the supervenience base is indeed sufficient; he considers, among others, masked dispositions, idealized dispositions, appealing to rules housed in our mental architecture, and appealing to standards for sufficiency of the supervenience base determined by our biological set-up, but finds all of these strategies wanting. He therefore concludes that Kripke's argument succeeds in establishing at least this: either naturalistic, dispositional facts fail to determine meaning-facts, or if they do, meaning facts are indeterminate.

Kripke's skeptical considerations on meaning-facts are also the subject of Horwich's "Kripke's Wittgenstein". Here we see a different reaction to Kripke's arguments, which questions his idea that no non-semantic facts can explain the truth-conditional aspects of expressions. In Horwich's view, we do not need to couch meaning in truth-conditional terms, for there is a Wittgensteinian alternative: defining meaning in terms of use (or dispositions thereof). We could then say that the fact that "dog" is used to refer to dogs constitutes the meaning of "dog" and that this explains the truth-conditional import of "dog". More specifically, through an inference to the best explanation, we might say that meaning-constituting use is governed by an ideal law, where an ideal law, familiar from the methodology of science, describes how a certain system would behave in the absence of certain distorting factors. It is by appealing to ideal laws that we are able to resist Kripke's skeptical reasoning.

Although the essays are exclusively accessible to an audience that is already well-versed in the philosophy of language, some are broader in scope and therefore offer relatively fewer technical insights into a variety of issues/ I am thinking of Pettit's piece on truth and accuracy,; Misak's historical reconstruction of truth pragmatism, Richard's development of an expressivist semantics, Bar-On's admirably clear and illuminating study of the notion of expression, and Lance's advocacy of a notion of lived normativity. One could then consider approaching this collection by reading some of the more general contributions first, then proceeding to the more technical ones, where a stronger analytic background is required. Nevertheless, the book is certainly not suitable for beginners or amateurs. It is advanced and highly sophisticated philosophical work, done by some of the best minds in Western academia today.


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Gibbard, A. 2013, Meaning and Normativity. Oxford University Press.

Horisk, C. 2007, "The Expressive Role of Truth in Truth-Conditional Semantics". Philosophical Quarterly 57 (229): 535-557.

Kripke, S. A. 1982, Wittgenstein on Rules and Private Language. Harvard University Press.

McDowell, J. 1994, Mind and World. Harvard University Press.

McDowell, J. 2009, "Wittgensteinian 'Quietism'." Common Knowledge 15 (3): 365-372.

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Price, H. Simon Blackburn, Robert Brandom, Paul Horwich & Michael Williams 2013, Expressivism, Pragmatism and Representationalism. Cambridge University Press.

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