Meaning without Truth

Placeholder book cover

Stefano Predelli, Meaning without Truth, Oxford University Press, 2013, 230pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199695638.

Reviewed by Brett Sherman, University of Rochester


It is difficult to make significant theoretical progress without an adequate framework within which theories can be presented. The fruitfulness of truth-conditional semantics owes much to the various frameworks that have been developed in aid of the general program.

Alas, some meaning is non-truth-conditional. While attention to non-truth-conditional phenomena has steadily increased, progress has been slowed by the absence of a prominent unifying framework within which theories of non-truth-conditional meaning can be presented. Stefano Predelli aims to provide such a framework in this timely and engaging book.

One of the greatest aspects of the book is the wide range of seemingly heterogeneous linguistic phenomena on display. Predelli's general argumentative strategy is to showcase how his framework can be employed to explain the phenomenon in question, as opposed to focusing at length on the philosophical issues underlying the framework itself, or to comparing the framework with other approaches.

Reading the book thus feels like taking a helicopter tour of the forest of non-truth-conditional meaning, dipping down every so often to get a better look at the trees. Readers hoping to examine the roots and the soil will need to come back and visit the forest on their own. But the tour is an invaluable guide to the forest, and a fun trip, to boot.

Predelli's central idea is that we can account for non-truth-conditional meaning in terms of constraints on appropriate contexts of use. He argues that, in addition to being encoded with a truth-conditional contribution, or character, expressions are encoded with what he calls a bias: a condition in which a context counts as an appropriate context of use of the expression. The conventional meaning of an expression can be thought of as a character-bias pair.

The book is divided into three parts, each devoted to a different concept. The central concept of bias is presented in the second part. The first part, concerning Predelli's concept of settlement, sets the stage for the second. The third part, concerning Predelli's concept of obstinacy, is an extended case study, in which a specific phenomenon concerning the semantics of demonstrative reference is explained in terms of the framework presented in Part Two. In the rest of this review, I will present a brief critical summary of Parts One and Three, before turning to a more general evaluation of the framework presented in Part Two.

Part One sets the stage by introducing, from the ground up, all of the conceptual elements that play a role in Predelli's framework, including the concept of settlement. Settlement is a generalization of the concept of truth in all contexts, in which the concept is relativized to a type of use. Some sentences are not true in all contexts, but are true in all contexts of a certain type. They exhibit a kind of guaranteed truth, but not a guaranteed truth solely in virtue of meaning. Predelli speaks of such sentences as being settled relative to the type of use in question.

Here's an example of my own to illustrate the idea. Suppose that you're watching the news on NBC when the reporter turns to the camera and says, "You're watching NBC". A bit further on in the broadcast, the reporter turns to the camera and -- more presumptuously -- says, "You're drinking a bourbon on the rocks." There is a significant difference between the reporter's two utterances. There is a kind of guarantee associated with the first utterance that is lacking from the second. Crucially, the guarantee is not due to the character of the first sentence alone. If I were to utter that sentence to you in an ordinary face-to-face context, I would say something false. We can say that 'You're watching NBC' is settled relative to only the first type of use, while 'You're drinking a bourbon on the rocks' is settled relative to neither type of use.

What exactly counts as a type of use? It will help to first look at how Predelli conceives of contexts. Following up on his 2005 book, Predelli conceives of contexts as n-tuples of a familiar Kaplanian sort, representing "those (typically extra-linguistic) aspects of an episode of language use that matter for semantic evaluation" (26). However, not every context represents a situation in which an expression is used. The set of contexts of use is thus a subset of the set of contexts.

Predelli makes two further classifications of contexts of use. First, a given context might be a context of a particular type of use: for example, it might represent a face-to-face use, or a text-message use. For any type of use, there is a class of contexts that represent that type. Second, a given context might be a context in which a particular expression is used appropriately, in accordance with its conventional meaning. For any expression, there is a class of contexts of (appropriate) use of that expression.

A theory of a particular type of use is constructed by positing necessary conditions for membership in the type. For example, c is a context of face-to-face use only if the speaker of c and the addressee of c are located at the location of c at the time of c. This condition may not be met by a context that represents a text-message use of an expression. In order to construct a complete theory of face-to-face uses, we would need additional conditions. Predelli suggests that the boundaries of a given type of use might be unclearly defined or negotiable (see footnote 7 on p. 34). We might, for example, disagree about whether the agent in a face-to-face context needs to be awake. How we decide will affect which sentences are settled relative to face-to-face uses.

I think that Predelli misses an opportunity to invoke his concept of settlement to make types of use more precise. Rather than thinking of a type of use as a coarse-grained generalization (e.g., face-to-face, soliloquy, text-message), we can individuate types of use finely in terms of the sentences they settle. We will need a somewhat fine-grained conception anyway if we wish to explain why, for example, the station-identification broadcast on NBC would not be settled were it broadcast on CBS. More importantly, we can collapse the distinction between types of use and contexts of use of an expression. Both can be thought of as classes of contexts that are individuated by the sentences they settle.

Contexts of use of an expression figure centrally in Predelli's bias framework. Types of use, and their relation to settlement, play a cautionary role. If we ignore how types of use can result in relativized guaranteed truth, we are liable to fallaciously account for intuitions about guaranteed truth in terms of truth-conditions, or character. Predelli labels this heretical move the Fallacy of Misplaced Character. When we commit the Fallacy, we let truth-conditional meaning shoulder too great a semantic burden, similar to the mistake of accounting for conversational implicatures in terms of conventional semantic meaning. In Part Two, Predelli introduces his "Theory of Bias" to fill the semantic gap left by character.

Whereas the character of an expression is a conventionally assigned function that determines a truth-condition, the bias of an expression is a conventionally assigned constraint on membership in the context of use of the expression. Predelli's theory is that expressions have both a bias and a character, though some have a null bias, and some a null character.

The expressions 'alas' and 'hurray' are examples of biased expressions with null character. On page 73, Predelli offers the following account of the biases of 'alas' and 'hurray' when used to modify a sentence s. A given context c is a member of the context of use of 'alas s' only if the agent of c is unfavorably disposed toward the content of s with respect to c. A given context c is a member of the context of use of 'hooray s' only if the agent of c is favorably disposed toward the content of s with respect to c. The bulk of Part Two is devoted to showing how conventional constraints of this sort can explain differences in a variety of expressions such as register (e.g., the difference between the character-identical terms 'stomach' and 'tummy'), derogatory slurs, and honorifics. In each case, the goal is not to provide a correct semantic theory of the expression in question, but to show how the "Theory of Bias" provides the resources in which a theory can be stated.

In Part Three, Predelli shows how his bias-based framework allows for the possibility of demonstratives whose demonstratum is given by the sentence itself. The result is semantic context-dependence without any contextually variable interpretation, or what Predelli calls obstinacy. Allowing for obstinacy opens the door to novel explanations of the semantics and the truth-conditions for a range of puzzling expressions, such as vocatives ("It's a nasty view of things, Gerald"), Quine's famous 'Giorgione'-sentence, and quotation. I will sketch the approach to quotation to illustrate the rough idea.

Imagine someone who walks around holding a mirror up to reflect passers-by, while pointing at the mirror and saying, "That person is wonderful." Each utterance intuitively involves a sentence with the same character. The variability in interpretation stems from a variability in the relevant feature of the context of use. Had the mirror been affixed to the speaker so that it always faced her, and were she to continue to point at the mirror while uttering the above sentence, then each utterance would result in the same interpretation. But the obstinacy of the interpretation would result, not from the character of the sentence uttered, but from the conditions in which the sentence is being used.

On the theory of quotation that Predelli proposes (a modified Davidsonian theory), quotation marks function like the speaker pointing to the affixed mirror. At the level of character, a sentence such as ' 'Giorgione' contains exactly nine letters' is no different than the sentence 'this contains exactly nine letters'. The quotation marks function like a picture frame with an arrow pointing to whatever is depicted in the frame. However, ' 'Giorgione' contains exactly nine letters' has a determinate truth-value, while the truth-value of 'this contains exactly nine letters' varies with the context. The problem is to show how the demonstrative account of quotation can be reconciled with the seeming non-variability of interpretation that many sentences involving quotation, such as the one above, display.

The solution is to account for the obstinacy of the interpretation in terms of bias, rather than in terms of character. The only appropriate uses of ' 'Giorgione' contains exactly nine letters' are those in which the demonstrative picks out the name displayed in quotes. The sentence is thus reflexively settled, unlike the sentence ' 'Kevin' contains exactly nine letters'. We can thus explain our intuitions about the difference in truth-value between the two sentences without appealing to distinct characters. The difference between them is solely a matter of bias.

Again, Predelli is not primarily concerned with the details or correctness of the theories presented. His primary concern is to illustrate the theoretical resources made available by adopting his "Theory of Bias". I put "Theory of Bias" in quotes because I think it is misleading for Predelli to talk about a "theory" of bias. It's misleading in the same way that it would be misleading to call Possible World Semantics a theory of truth-conditional meaning. What Predelli offers is a theoretical framework: building blocks in terms of which theories of non-truth-conditional meaning can be stated. (I am echoing points made by Stalnaker (1997) about Possible World Semantics.)

I don't mean to suggest that there is a sharp line between theories and frameworks. There are theoretical presuppositions underlying both Possible World Semantics and Predelli's Bias Semantics. But the criteria of evaluation for theories and frameworks are different, in accordance with the different roles they play in inquiry. Correctness and incorrectness are not primarily at issue when evaluating a framework. The important question is whether the framework of Bias Semantics is adequate for theorizing about non-truth-conditional meaning. I will conclude with some worries about the adequacy of the framework.

The main sort of worry I have concerns the connection between bias and non-truth-conditional meaning. Bias could be used to theorize about truth-conditional meaning as much as non-truth-conditional meaning. At the same time, it isn't clear that bias by itself provides the resources to explain what is distinctive of different types of non-truth-conditional meaning.

Consider first an ordinary example of presupposition. The sentence 'It was the rabbit that exploded' presupposes that something exploded. However if we choose to explain the presuppositions that systematically arise with the cleft-construction, we can couch that explanation in terms of bias. For example, we can say that a given context c is a member of the class of contexts of use of sentences of the form 'It was the x that did φ' only if the conversational participants of c take for granted that something did φ. A condition such as this might require expanding the parameters in the context. But that won't stop us from formulating whatever condition we need to account for the presupposition.

The problem is that presuppositions have truth-conditions. If bias is designed to account for non-truth-conditional meaning, then we need some way of ruling out the possibility of accounting for presuppositions in terms of bias. It isn't clear to me how this can be done in a way that is properly motivated. Perhaps that isn't the goal of the framework. Perhaps the concept of bias is simply meant to provide the tools for accounting for non-truth-conditional, as well as some truth-conditional meaning.

But there is a deeper worry here. If we can account for both truth-conditional and non-truth-conditional meaning in terms of bias, then why bother distinguishing them? Why not account for all meaning in terms of bias? This seems like a mistake; we can call it the Fallacy of Misplaced Bias. But what's the mistake? What's special about truth-conditional meaning that makes it worth singling out? Truth-conditional meaning is special because representation is a central task of language use.

A framework for non-truth-conditional meaning ideally ought to provide resources useful for the task performed. What task does a given kind of non-truth-conditional meaning perform? It depends. A use of an expression might function to impose an information state on the context, to bring about a change in preferences, to introduce a question under discussion. Like the example of presupposition, all of these tasks can be accounted for in terms of bias. But that only highlights the fact that bias is not tied to any one task. The framework, in other words, is so general that much of the work needed to account for a particular type of non-truth-conditional meaning will need to be reconstructed from within the framework.

Despite these worries, Predelli's framework is an extremely valuable tool for theorizing about the underexplored territory of non-truth-conditional meaning. His book is a highly original, thought-provoking contribution to a literature that should only continue to grow. It should be required reading for any philosophers and linguists working on non-truth-conditional meaning.


Predelli, S. (2005). Contexts: Meaning, Truth, and the Use of Language. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Stalnaker, R. (1997). Reference and Necessity. Reprinted in Ways a World Might Be, 2003, Oxford: Oxford University Press.