Meaningful Work

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Andrea Veltman, Meaningful Work, Oxford University Press, 2016, 237pp., $90.00, ISBN 9780190618179.

Reviewed by Russell Muirhead, Dartmouth College


Once at the center of social and political theory, over the past fifty years, the subject of work has become peripheral. The displacement of work, Andrea Veltman argues, stems from three sources: first, a belief that work (as opposed to leisure) is not in fact central to living well; second, a view that any account of fulfilling or meaningful work must be irretrievably subjective; and third, commitment to cashing out conceptions of justice and well-being in terms of goods that all people in principle can possess. The task of the book is to answer each of these concerns.

Veltman succeeds in answering each of these concerns. The opening chapter consults a range of philosophic, religious, and empirical accounts that show why meaningful work is essential to a good life. Conversely, as she shows in chapter 2, oppressive work, "work that weighs people down, assaults self-esteem, diminishes mental health, or denies meaningful agency undermines the global autonomy of a worker as a person" (75). This sets up the most important part or her argument -- to rebut the subjectivist claim that any sense of what counts as fulfilling work only reflects the idiosyncratic tastes of particular persons. Looking to contemporary figures like Susan Wolf and ancient ones like Aristotle, Veltman constructs a multidimensional and pluralistic account of meaningful work that consists of four key elements: the exercise of capacities; the support of virtues (self-respect, honor, integrity, and dignity); a relation to an urgent personal purpose or a useful social purpose; and a connection to other important aspects of a worker's life (117).

This is a capacious conception of meaningful work, grounded in the experience of work and an appreciation for the unbounded diversity of that experience­­­.  Veltman's account is "an ode to the multiplicity of ways in which work can be meaningful" (141). Indeed, as she says, "nearly all forms of work have at least an element of meaningfulness" (135). And yet, all work is not necessarily meaningful -- certainly not equally meaningful:

When people work at degraded jobs, when they hear intimations as a result of their work that they are unworthy, unintelligent, incompetent, untrustworthy, or of lesser caliber, or when they occupy roles in which they merely follow the directions of others, work undermines the well-being of the person (138-139).

This raises a critical question of distributive justice: can all work be meaningful? And if not, what (if anything) might justify the fact that some have relatively more meaningful work, while others endure relatively meaningless work? Noting that consumer goods are made largely by "people who are beaten down by their work in globally entrenched economic organizations," she says that "it is hard to conceive of how we can arrive at a world in which the abundance of mass-produced stuff for sale is replaced by an abundance of opportunity for richly meaningful work" (144). Put differently, she sees a trade-off between material prosperity and meaningful work. To generate more meaningful work would require placing more importance on the intrinsic aspects of work (its connection to capacities and virtues, its connection to important purposes and to our larger lives) over its instrumental function (to produce goods and services). To get richer in one sense is to get poorer in another.

Veltman thinks we would do well to trade some material prosperity for more meaningful work. But this trade applies at the level of individuals rather than at the level of politics: it bears on business owners, managers, and individual workers, but not on legislatures. People do not have a right to meaningful work, she argues (189-190).

In Veltman's argument, a right to meaningful work is infeasible for two reasons. For one, the state is simply not the kind of instrument that can be used very effectively to both create meaningful work and ensure that each person is matched to the right kind of work. This reflects her pluralistic conception of meaningful work: what is meaningful for me will not necessarily be so meaningful for you. Meaningful work is about a fit between individuals and their work -- often an exquisite kind of fit that is impossible to fully discern from the outside. No administrative entity operating on tens of millions of citizens could successfully align individuals with the work that would be meaningful for them. The state might regulate working conditions to prevent or to ameliorate the worst kinds of work; but it is simply the wrong tool for guaranteeing meaningful work for each person (even if the state can and should create background conditions that increase the opportunity to pursue meaningful jobs).

More profoundly, it is impractical, Veltman argues, for everyone in the economy to have meaningful work. Some amount of bad work -- dirty, dangerous, repetitive, invisible, stunting, meaningless -- is a necessity. Every society will inevitably give rise to such work, and thus every society will have to find some way of enticing or coercing people to do it, even though doing it may likely have a punishing effect on their own happiness. If this is right, it only intensifies the question of justice: who gets to do the good work, and who is relegated to the bad work?

Veltman's impulse is to endorse some mode of sharing bad work such that no one's working life is entirely defined by the worst kind of work. But she argues that the strategy of sharing bad work, which could work at the level of the household, will not work in the larger political economy (162). Sharing bad work will be impractical in many cases because the work in question requires specialization. More obviously, it will not work because some people would rather free ride and will resist sharing work they would rather let others do for them. They will opt out, or do a bad job, and shirk. Compelling free riders to comply with the sharing regime would introduce a level of surveillance, administrative control, and violence that would be worse than the problem we are trying to solve by sharing work in the first place.

Here one sees the common-sense sensibility that suffuses this book at its most forceful: Veltman does not suppose that the world of work can be remade to conform to our ethical ideals, nor that human beings can be remade such that the problem of free riding disappears. Veltman is attentive to the ideals of human flourishing but also to constraints of feasibility, and she resists easy utopianism. The book is marked by a capacious sensibility and a deceptive mastery of the relevant scholarship in philosophy, political theory, psychology, and sociology -- deceptive only in that the writing is graceful and jargon free.

Veltman argues that the ideal of meaningful work does its work on an individual level -- by persuading people, one by one, such that they make different choices for themselves and, when they have the ability, make different choices available for others. Veltman concedes that meaningful work is a good that not all can enjoy. For her, this registers as a grave cost, because if Veltman is an Aristotelian of a sort (who takes human flourishing seriously) she is also an egalitarian. All may deserve meaningful work, but the reality of things is that not all can enjoy it.

What Veltman does not consider is the possibility that technological development is expanding the supply of meaningful work, first by substituting robotic automation for the most punishing jobs, and then by multiplying the kinds of service work (where people serve each other), where relational and communicative capacities are exercised and the effect of one's labor is immediately felt. If the nuanced fit between individuals and their jobs that is at the core of meaningful work was elusive in the agricultural economy (where nearly everyone toiled in fields or household service) and still in the industrial economy (where Taylorist separation of conception and execution degraded work), perhaps there is reason to hope that the economy of tomorrow will provide more humane, meaningful work than the economies of the past. The trade-off between a productive economy and a moral economy might relax. This may be possible -- but if it is, it will not happen on its own; it will require citizens attuned to the ethic of meaningful work that Veltman, as much as anyone, has rendered in such a clear and powerful way.