Meanings and Other Things: Themes from the Work of Stephen Schiffer

Placeholder book cover

Gary Ostertag (ed.), Meanings and Other Things: Themes from the Work of Stephen Schiffer, Oxford University Press, 537 pp., $115.00, ISBN 9780199684939.

Reviewed by Indrek Reiland, University of Barcelona


Over the course of the past half century, Stephen Schiffer has written a highly influential book in philosophy of language every fifteen years, plus countless influential papers in-between. His first book, Meaning (1972), set out the ambitious Gricean program with the aim of analyzing linguistic meaning in terms of speaker meaning and speaker meaning in terms of intention, ultimately hoping for a reduction of intention and other propositional attitudes in non-intentional terms. This was followed by Remnants of Meaning (1987) which criticized and ultimately dismantled the previous program. His last effort, The Things We Mean (2003), tries to reconcile the two previous time-slices by taking on board the pessimistic lessons of the second book, while still offering an account of linguistic meaning.

This Festschrift dedicated to Schiffer's work consists of an editor's introduction, 14 papers, and his replies. Most of the contributions respond to Things or papers published around that time; they fall into four groups. First, there are four papers on easy ontology and pleonastic entities by Amie Thomasson, Thomas Hofweber, Ian Rumfitt, and Michael Smith. Second, there are three papers on propositional attitude reports by Gary Ostertag, Ray Buchanan, and Nathan Salmon (a reprint of Salmon 2006). Next, there are four papers on vagueness and paradoxes by Dorothy Edgington, Hartry Field, Crispin Wright, and Paul Horwich (also printed in Horwich 2010). Finally, there are three papers on the Gricean program and issues concerning reference and definite descriptions by Stephen Neale, Anita Avramides, and Kent Bach.

Frequently the most useful part of an edited volume is the introduction, and Ostertag's is essential reading for anyone who wants to get a handle on Schiffer's views and their development over time. I want to start by saying something general about Schiffer's approach to linguistic meaning that comes up in the introduction and informs several of his replies.

What does an account of linguistic meaning consist of? Schiffer seems to conceive of meaning on what we might call the Object Model. Having a meaning is like having a cow (or the money you can buy it with). There's the thing, the meaning, and then there's the having of it, which consists in standing in the "meaning relation" to it. Thus, there seem to be two questions to be answered. First, what are meanings? Second, what is it for an expression to have one in a language. I have something to say about both parts, starting with the second.

Ostertag portrays Schiffer as posing the second question as follows: "In virtue of what does an expression have the meaning that it does among a group of speakers G?". This, in turn, gets transformed, following David Lewis. First, one stipulates that a language or "Lewis-language" (e.g., French as currently spoken) is an abstract object, a set of sentences with their meanings such that the sentences have their meanings essentially. Second, one asks: "What determines that the members of G speak this language rather than another one?". Schiffer's answer takes the form:

A sentence x has meaning M among G just when, for some language L, (i) x has meaning M in L, and (ii) L is used by G.

Ostertag says that to fill this out, one doesn't need to analyze 'x has meaning M in L'. One only needs to say when L is used by G, to specify the so-called actual-language relation. As he puts it, once this is done: "there is no further question that needs to be addressed." (p. 7) Schiffer later says the same (p. 507).

I've always found the Lewis-like setup at best a distraction. Instead of asking directly what is it for an expression to have a meaning in an actual language like French as currently spoken, one defines what amounts intuitively to a mere potential language and then one asks what is it for a group to speak one of these potential languages as its language. In any case, care is needed here in how we state the question. Consider, for a moment, truth and truth-making. It's one thing to ask what it is for something to be true, seeking an analysis. It's another thing to ask in virtue of what are truths true, what make truths or grounds truth-facts. Now, similarly, it's one thing to ask what is it for an expression to have a meaning, seeking an analysis. It's another thing to ask in virtue of what do expressions have the meanings that they actually do, what makes meanings or grounds meaning-facts. That these are separate questions is highlighted by the fact that one could think that the first question lacks a substantive answer because truth or meaningfulness are primitive and unanalyzable while still trying to answer the second question.

Now let's come back to how Ostertag portrays Schiffer as setting things up. It uses an 'In virtue of' form, and this makes it a bit unclear whether we're asking for a reductive analysis or a completely different story about meaning-making. But let's assume that it's the former. This makes one wonder why it is that we don't need to analyze, for Lewis-Languages, 'x has meaning M in L'. (There is no question about meaning-making for Lewis-Languages since that is settled by fiat). The answer seems to be that 'meaning' in the above locution is not to be taken in an ordinary, but a stipulated sense (Schiffer 2017). But then it becomes all the more puzzling why the roundabout way of setting things up should be helpful at all.

What about Schiffer's view of meanings? In Things, he argues that the linguistic meaning of a sentence can't be a mere propositional blueprint to be filled in by resolving context-sensitivity (a la Kaplan's character) but must further include information contributed by sentence mood. He calls meanings thus conceived characters*, and represents them as a template consisting of the propositional blueprint + an intended speech act. For example, the character* of 'Finish your coffee!' is <commanding, the proposition that i finishes her coffee at t> (where i is the addressee of the context and t the time). However, this raises a problem. Given that meaning is what knowledge of meaning is knowledge of, we should know expressions' characters*. However, Schiffer thinks, and Ostertag seems to agree, it's implausible that ordinary speakers have such knowledge since speakers wouldn't recognize these things as meanings. This leads him to the claim that either knowledge of meaning has to be understood in some novel way or that expressions don't really have meanings at all but only characters*.

We can find a way out of this dilemma if we focus on the fact that like Kaplan's characters, Schiffer's characters* are mere formal representations of whatever meanings really are. One reason why Schiffer hasn't been able to tell us more about what meanings really are might be his implicit acceptance of the Object Model, which could lead one to conceive of meanings as things that need to be characterized independently of answering the question about having them. In fact, this is how he proceeds in Things. But suppose one rejects this assumption and asks first, what is it for an expression to have a meaning in a language. One interesting idea is that it is for there to be a rule for the use of the expression that determines the conditions in which it may be used. On this view, meanings are use-conditions. The character* of 'Finish your coffee!', <commanding, the proposition that i finishes her coffee at t> could be just a formal representation of a rule which tells us that a speaker may use the sentence iff she intends to command a person she's addressing to finish her coffee at the time of speaking. And perhaps it wouldn't be implausible to think that ordinary speakers' knowledge of meaning consists in knowing such use-conditions.

One way in which Festschrifts can interestingly go beyond usual edited collections is by including the honoree's replies. Many of the exchanges here are fascinating and most of them resist short summaries. For example, I would highly recommend Amie Thomasson's "Easy Ontology and Its Consequences" together with Schiffer's reply to anyone interested in the metaphysics of propositions and properties and metametaphysics more generally. However, I will look more closely at two other exchanges which for me were the highlights of the volume.

Ray Buchanan's "Schiffer's Puzzle: A Kind of Fregean Response" reacts to one of Schiffer's less known papers "What Reference Has to Tell Us About Meaning" (2005). In that paper, Schiffer discusses beliefs like my belief that I'm hungry. Most philosophers agree that having this belief involves thinking of myself in a special, first-person way. Yet, when I say to you that I'm hungry, understanding what I say doesn't require you to think of me in the first-person way. Now, on the face of it, I say what I believe. But then it seems that what I believe and say and which you grasp when understanding me must be such that for different people to have an attitude with it as its content, they need to think of the relevant object in different ways or under different modes of presentation (MOPs). In Schiffer's terms, the thing I believe and say, the proposition, must have what he calls the relativity feature.

Standard Russellian and Fregean views don't allow any propositions to have the relativity feature and thus they must explain away how things seem. The Russellians who start from what's public and tie their notion of propositional content primarily to propositional attitude reports try to account for this by claiming that it's our states of belief and understanding that somehow involve the different MOPs, whereas the believed and grasped content is the same Russellian proposition <Indrek, being hungry>. The Fregeans, who start from what's private and tie their notion of propositional content primarily to the individual's perspective, try to account for this by claiming that what I believe does indeed involve a different MOP than what you grasp when you understand me, but insisting that there is no problem since communication doesn't require transfer of content, but only mutual knowledge of suitable correspondence between the contents (Heck 2002, McDowell 1998). Schiffer argues that neither of these strategies works and that this provides further support for his theory of pleonastic propositions which can allow for propositions to have the relativity feature.

Buchanan develops the Fregean view and defends it against Schiffer's objections. On his picture, we believe Fregean propositions like <IndrekDE SE, being hungry>. However, and this is where he goes beyond McDowell and Heck, on his view we never say, we don't even try to communicate, exactly what we believe. Rather, in the above case I say a Fregean proposition-type Φ which abstracts away from the relevant MOP and is basically equivalent to the Russellian proposition <Indrek, being hungry>.

Schiffer doesn't like such views because he thinks that they can't allow for what I say to be what I believe. Consider examples like the following:

1)  I'm hungry.
2)  By uttering 1), I said that I'm hungry.
3)  I believe that I'm hungry.

On Buchanan's account, the that-clause in 2) doesn't refer to the Fregean proposition, but then it also can't refer to it in 3). But then, when are reports such as 3) true?

Buchanan's solution is to start from Kent Bach's claim that belief reports never report what we believe, but only indirectly and partially characterize it. First, consider the following report:

4)  Alex said that I'm hungry

On Buchanan's view, this has something like the following logical form (where Φ is the contextually relevant proposition-type):

4´) Says (Alex, Φ)

Here, the that-clause refers to the proposition-type. Now consider the following report:

5)  Alex believes that I'm hungry

On Buchanan's view this has a different logical form (where, again, Φ is the contextually relevant proposition-type and p is a proposition of that type)

5´) p (Φp & Believes (Alex, p)) 

The that-clause still refers, not to the proposition, but to the proposition-type. But 'believes' triggers an existential reading much like 'owns' in 'Mary owns that kind of dog'. Thus, the report tells us that there is some Fregean proposition from the relevant type such that Alex believes that proposition.

This is an interesting view. Unsurprisingly, Schiffer doesn't like it. One of the reasons he gives in his reply is the following worry. Schiffer claims that 'Logicism' is the name of a proposition, namely that mathematics reduces to logic. Now, consider:

6)  Jill believes logicism.
7)  Jill believes the proposition that mathematics reduces to logic.
8)  Jill believes that mathematics reduces to logic.

Schiffer claims that in 6), 'Logicism' refers to the proposition that mathematics reduces to logic. He then claims it follows that in 7), the NP 'the proposition that mathematics reduces to logic' also refers to that proposition. Finally, he claims that since 7) is a pleonastic equivalent of 8), the that-clause should also refer to the proposition. But Buchanan can't allow for this, so he is in trouble.

All of the steps in the above argument are dubious. First, names like 'Logicism' do not refer to propositions, but views which are more coarse-grained than propositions in being expressible by different sentences expressing different propositions (e.g., 'Mathematics is reducible to logic' vs. 'Mathematics is not irreducible to logic') (Salmon 1992). Second, even if one would agree that names like 'Logicism' refer to propositions, it's unclear why it would follow that NPs like 'the proposition that mathematics reduces to logic' refer to propositions rather than somehow describing them. Finally, and perhaps most importantly, the NP and the that-clause are clearly not pleonastic equivalents. Consider:

  9) Scott likes the proposition that mathematics reduces to logic.
10) Scott likes that mathematics reduces to logic.

9) attributes to Scott a completely kosher attitude of liking a particular proposition, perhaps as a pet example. In contrast, 10) attributes to him a problematic attitude of liking that something is the case that in fact isn't. Thus, it's hard to see why Buchanan should be moved by Schiffer's first worry. Nevertheless, Schiffer is correct that the above view does get in trouble explaining the validity of inferences like the following:

11) Jill said that mathematics reduces to logic.
12) Jack believes that mathematics reduces to logic.
13) There is something that Jill said, and Jack believes.

All in all, Schiffer's original paper and Buchanan's paper should be of immense interest to anyone who's puzzled about the tricky relations of mental state and speech act content.

The second paper I want to comment on is Stephen Neale's massive, 112(!)-page "Silent Reference," which takes up more than a fifth of the volume. This paper takes off from Schiffer's "Indexicals and the Theory of Reference" (1981) and "Belief Ascription" (1992). In the former, Schiffer proposed roughly the following analysis of speaker reference in terms of speaker meaning:

S refers to o in uttering x just in case, in uttering x, S means a singular, o-dependent proposition.

He then went on to define a notion of speaker reference with an expression and the notion of implicit reference. In the latter paper Schiffer criticized theories of belief reports which relied on implicit reference to MOPs. Later, he extended the criticism to theories of knowledge, incomplete definite descriptions, and other phenomena which relied on implicit reference. The relevant objection is the meaning-intention problem. If to refer is to mean, and to mean is to have audience-directed intentions, then speakers who implicitly refer to something must have intentions about what they're implicitly referring to. For example, if I say 'It's raining' then it's plausible that I'm intending to refer to a particular location. If asked 'Where?', I can at least provide an answer. However, Schiffer argues, in the case of supposed implicit reference to MOPs, epistemic standards, completing properties etc., such intentions seem to be lacking and speakers are at a loss when asked to specify the relevant one.

Neale's aim in this rich paper is to refine Schiffer's analysis of the aforementioned notions and discuss a variety of implicit reference, namely reference by using aphonic expressions, expressions which lack any phonological features (e.g., the so-called null constituents or empty categories like PRO). However, before getting to any of this, he provides a systematic discussion of a host of background issues. For example, he draws distinctions between speaker meaning/reference, expression meaning/reference, and argues that the notions of utterance meaning/reference don't make any sense. He discusses different forms of implicit reference and provides a plethora of examples. He talks about methodology and how the notions of meaning and interpretation interact. He provides a very interesting metaphysics of words vs. utterances which abandons the type-token distinction in favor of the idea that words and other expressions are abstract artefacts whereas utterances of them are concrete events which serve as their perceptible proxies. He distinguishes between metaphysical, epistemic, and aetiological determination. He defends the Gricean view that what a speaker means is wholly determined by his communicative intentions while linguistic meaning and context only constrain the communicative intention insofar as the speaker must rely on them to provide evidence for the interpreter to figure out what their intention is. He discusses different notions of saying and what is said. And he argues that for at least context-sensitive expressions, the talk of expression reference is just talk of speaker reference with the expression. This is great reading and highly recommended to anyone interested in seeing how at least one philosopher of language tries to make everything hang together.

Getting to the main part of the paper, Neale follows Schiffer in defining reference in terms of speaker-meaning. This has obvious, if unintended, echoes of Kant on the primacy of judgment and Frege and Wittgenstein on the context principle. As Neale says, the idea is that speaker meaning is primary and notions like reference and predication are to be defined in terms of it (contrast this with the "atomistic" Grice-inspired stories in Bach 1992, Bertolet 1987, and Stine 1978, as well as Peter Hanks's and Scott Soames's recent work). He also says that he thinks that there's something deeply wrong with the idea of a self-standing sub-propositional act of reference. But there are two different notions of reference. In one sense, to refer just is to make something a subject of predication. Presumably everybody would grant that reference in this sense doesn't make sense independent of the accompanying predication. However, there's also the more basic notion of just indicating an object without necessarily predicating something of it. For Neale's claim to be substantive, he must think that this notion is to be defined in terms of speaker meaning as well, and this is indeed what he seems to think (see fn. 76). However, there's a straightforward problem with this idea. For example, consider uses of names in calls like 'Paul!' or in vocative positions of imperatives like 'Paul, come here!'. In these cases, the name is not used to mean something about its bearer, but just to get the bearer's attention. But then it's unclear how such cases of "reference" could be explained in terms of the speaker's meaning something.

Leaving this aside, Neale improves on Schiffer's definition of speaker reference with an expression by expanding it to the notion of speaker reference with an expression relative to an occurrence:

RW) In uttering x, S referred to o with e relative to its i-th occurrence in x iff for some audience A and relation R, S intended A to recognize that R (e, x, i, o), and, at least partly on the basis of this, that S referred to o in uttering x.

As in Schiffer's definition of speaker meaning, the nature of R is left open and may be "any relation which S thinks will do the job" (Schiffer 1981: 65). For example, in the case of uttering 'Paul is a philosopher', R ('Paul', 'Paul is a philosopher', Paul) could just consist of the fact that 'Paul' occurs in the sentence and is Paul's name.

Next, Neale provides the following definitions of explicit or phonic reference, implicit reference, and aphonic reference:

RE) In uttering x, S referred to o explicitly iff there is a phonic in x with which S referred to o.

RI) In uttering x, S referred to o implicitly if (i) the truth-conditions of what S said are o-involving, (ii) but there is no phonic in x with which S referred to o.

RA) In uttering x, S referred to o aphonically iff there is an occurrence i of an aphonic e in x such that S referred to o with e, relative to i.

For example, if Sue uses 'It snowed this morning', meaning that it snowed in London this morning, then Sue has implicitly referred to London. It's a further question whether Sue has achieved this by using an aphonic or in some other way.

However, Neale argues that there are lots of cases where implicit reference is achieved by using aphonics. To take just one example, consider 14), where an aphonic is assumed to occur as the subject of the embedded gerundive clause (bracketed):

14) Sue remembers [e lecturing on aphonics].

Intuitively, someone uttering this sentence is referring to Sue twice, once, phonically, to the person remembering, and another time, aphonically, to the person lecturing.

Now, Schiffer argued against implicit reference theories by raising the meaning-intention problem. Aphonic reference doesn't quite give rise to the meaning-intention problem, which is a problem about the sorts of things people are supposed to be referring to. However, Neale argues that it gives rise to a related aphonic-intention problem which is a problem about the things people are supposedly referring with. If we look again at RW together with RA above, it's clear that they require speakers to have quite complex intentions about aphonics and it might seem quite implausible that they do. So there seems to be a tension between RW and the existence of aphonics. Nevertheless, Neale claims, we can hope to resolve the tension by claiming that speakers tacitly know which expressions contain aphonics and perhaps have something like tacit intentions about them.

In his reply, Schiffer takes Neale to task about the very last bit. He thinks that even though the aphonic-intention problem is indeed a serious problem for the Gricean, the tacit knowledge reply has no hope at all. One sense in which a speaker could be said to have 'tacit' knowledge and intentions is in Brian Loar's sense of implicit attitude, in which these are just ordinary attitudes that the person is not consciously aware of but could rather easily become aware of (Loar 1976). Schiffer thinks that it's clear that no ordinary speaker has implicit knowledge about aphonics. Another sense is the Chomskyan sense of being sub-personally represented. However, Schiffer says, then the relevant states concerning aphonics do not amount to knowledge and, damningly, no sense can be made of tacit intentions.

This is a fascinating issue about which it is impossible to come to any conclusion on the basis of what Neale and Schiffer say here. However, I'm happy to report that it is further taken up in a recent special issue of Croatian Journal of Philosophy dedicated to Neale's paper, containing interesting papers by Schiffer himself, Dan Harris, Elmar Unnsteinsson, and Jesse Rappaport (Harris 2017, Rappaport 2017, Schiffer 2017, Unnsteinsson 2017). All in all, the Neale-Schiffer exchange and the follow-ups are essential reading for those interested in the current state of Gricean thought about language.

Let me sum up by making two mildly critical overall remarks. The first has to do with timing. Most of the papers respond to Things or papers published around the same time. In fact, in the case of Hofweber's paper, the editor has included a note according to which it was submitted, as one of the first papers, in 2006. A lot has happened in philosophy of language in the meantime and some of the papers in the volume can therefore feel a bit out of date. Second, to me, it was a bit disappointing that there were no papers on Schiffer's interesting proposals about linguistic meaning and knowledge of meaning in Things. Nevertheless, there's a lot to chew on here, and one can only hope that because fifteen years have passed since his last book, Schiffer provides us a with another book-length update of his views soon.


Thanks to Ray Buchanan, Ben Lennertz, and Gary Ostertag for comments and discussion.


Bach, K. 1992. "Intentions and Demonstrations". Analysis, 52, pp. 140-146

Bertolet, R. 1987. "Speaker Reference". Philosophical Studies, 52, pp. 199-226

Harris, D. 2017. "Speaker Reference and Cognitive Architecture". Croatian Journal of Philosophy, 17, pp. 319-349

Horwich, P. 2010. Truth-Meaning-Reality. Oxford University Press

Loar, B. 1976. "The Semantics of Singular Terms". Philosophical Studies, 30, pp. 353-377

Rappaport, J. 2017. "Is there a Meaning-Intention Problem". Croatian Journal of Philosophy, 17, pp. 383-397

Salmon, N. 1992. "On Content". Mind, 101, pp. 733-751

Salmon, N. 2006. "The Resilience of Illogical Belief". Nous, 40, pp. 369-75

Schiffer, S. 1981. "Indexicals and the Theory of Reference". Synthese, 23, pp. 43-100

Schiffer, S. 1992. "Belief Ascription". Journal of Philosophy, 89, pp. 499-521

Schiffer, S. 2003. The Things We Mean. Oxford University Press

Schiffer, S. 2005. "What Reference Has to Tell Us about Meaning". Conteude e Cognicao: Actas de Seminario de Filosofia Analitica 2003-2004. Ed. J. Branquinho, University of Lisbon Press

Schiffer, S. 2017a. "Intention and Convention in the Theory of Meaning". A Companion to Philosophy of Language, 2nd Ed. Ed. B. Hale, C. Wright, A. Miller. John Wiley & Sons, pp. 49-72

Schiffer, S. 2017b. "Gricean Semantics and Vague Speaker-Meaning". Croatian Journal of Philosophy, 17, pp. 293-317

Stine, G. C. 1978. "Meaning Other Than What We Say and Referring". Philosophical Studies, 33, pp. 319-337

Unnsteinsson, J. 2017. "Saying without Knowing What or How". Croatian Journal of Philosophy, 17, pp. 351-382