Meanings as Species

Meanings As Species Book Cover

Mark Richard, Meanings as Species, Oxford University Press, 2019, 212pp., $72.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198842811.

Reviewed by Indrek Reiland, University of Vienna


This book explores the idea that the meanings of words are like biological species. On Mark Richard's view, the meaning of a word in a group's language is what he calls its interpretive common ground or ICG. The ICG of 'cousin' in the English of the residents of Boston is the set of presuppositions about the term they normally make and are expected to make: "that cousins are relatives, that cousins are the children of your folks' sisters and brothers, that people have cousins but dogs and bumblebees do not, etc." (49) Meanings qua ICGs are like species in being historical, process-like entities that can gradually change over time.

The book is divided into six chapters. In chapter 1, Richard frames the overall project as growing out of a desire to reconcile Quine's view that any meaning-related, supposedly analytic claim like 'cats are animals' can be given up without changing the meaning 'cat', with the common-sense view that the notion of meaning is perfectly acceptable. Chapter 2 dismantles internalist attempts to resuscitate an epistemologically interesting notion of analyticity. These two chapters form more something like the background to the view to be offered, rather than being part of the view itself.

In chapters 3-4, Richard starts developing the view of meanings qua ICGs. In the first, he sets out the basics while simultaneously defending the traditional view of philosophy as conceptual analysis. In the second, he starts discussing meaning change and how it relates to questions of sameness of reference and extension over time.

In chapter 5, Richard discusses how meanings qua ICGs are related to propositional attitude ascriptions. As he himself puts it, this chapter is again somewhat of a digression from the main thread. Finally, chapter 6 continues the discussion of meaning change, looking at concrete cases and how they could be explained, starting with the simpler examples of 'skyline' and 'gay' and ending with the staple contested cases of 'rape' and 'marry'.

Many of the chapters contain further brief, relatively self-sufficient discussions of specific philosophers' recent arguments that are more or less loosely related to the central thread: Russell on analyticity (Ch. 1), Chalmers on conceptual continuity (Ch. 2), Cappelen on intuitions (Ch. 3), Field on deflationism (Ch. 4), Dorr and Hawthorne on speech reports (Ch. 5), and Haslanger on conceptual engineering (Ch. 6).

As should be evident from the above overview, the discussion is wide-ranging, moves criss-cross in different directions, and contains many digressions. The downside of the breadth is that the view of meanings qua ICGs and of meaning change is left at a somewhat impressionistic level and is hard to pin down precisely. Partly because the exposition of its tenets is spread out between the chapters, and partly because of the conversational style, readers have to do quite a bit of work themselves to piece together something that can be compared to alternatives and critically assessed. Below is my best attempt, together with some questions that arose.

Meanings and concepts

Words have meanings in languages. But what is meant by 'meaning'? Richard is commendably explicit in making clear that he's interested in meaning in the sense of what competent speakers grasp, "the anchor of linguistic competence" (3, 49). On the other hand, the relevant notion of competence is left entirely intuitive in a way that is potentially problematic. In any case, as we saw above, a word's meaning qua the anchor of competence is supposed to be its ICG.

Richard takes a word's meaning to be equivalent to the concept it expresses (50, 53-54). In saying this, he must primarily be thinking of concept-words like 'cousin' and 'pasta'. But aren't there important differences between the notions of linguistic meaning qua the anchor of competence and the notion of concept, however construed? There are some words such as 'hello' and 'ouch' which clearly have meanings, but which nobody takes to express concepts. And there are some words like 'I' which have a single meaning in English, but which plausibly express a different concept in each of our mouths. This is not to mention further problems raised by context-sensitive and polysemous words and their complex relations to concepts.

Is the view of meaning qua ICG on offer supposed to cover words like 'hello' and 'I' as well, or is Richard actually primarily interested in concept-words or even concepts themselves? It is not totally clear. On the one hand, he says that in cases like 'hello' the ICG is exhausted by information about how the word is used (is in fact used? Or how it is correct or permissible to use it, like Kaplan, to whom Richard refers to, would have it?). On the other hand, he grants that a lot of what he has to say, especially about meaning change, sounds much more plausible when put in terms of concepts (128).

Richard also thinks that we need to add "pragmatic" information to the ICG of words along the lines of: "in uttering 'snow' the speaker is referring to snow, in uttering 'is white' the speaker is ascribing the property of whiteness to what she referred to with 'snow'; to do this sort of thing -- refer to x and go on to ascribe y to it -- is to assert that x is y." (71) But already this seems to drive a wedge between the notions of meaning and concept. Presumably no such information is included in characterization of the relevant concepts. Furthermore, one might wonder whether such information might not be sufficient for an account of the specifically linguistic meanings qua anchors of competence with the relevant words. If I tell you that, in Estonian, 'lumi' is for referring to snow, 'on valge' is for predicating whiteness and to do that is to say that snow is white, what more do you need to know to be able to use 'Lumi on valge' in Estonian? Thus, one might wonder whether the sort of rich descriptive information Richard takes to be part of the ICG of 'cousin' might be better thought to have something to do with the concept cousin or even something further like a conception of cousins, a set of beliefs or presuppositions about them.

From Idiolects to Shared Languages

Words have meanings in languages. But what is meant by 'a language'? Richard's explanatory starting point seems squarely individualist. He starts from idiolects, but unlike Davidson in his anti-language papers, he, like Lewis, works up to the notion of a shared language (Davidson 1986, Lewis 1975). Take individual speakers and their idiolects which partly consist of a lexicon, a set of words. The speakers make certain assumptions about the use of these words which take the form of descriptive claims a la "cousins are parents' siblings' progeny". Such a set of assumptions he calls the word's use (133). Speakers form groups that share a language in the sense that their uses are coordinated in forming the word's ICG. This explains why they can converse with each other without problems.

One might wonder what difference, if any, there is between the idiolectal uses construed as a set of assumptions and shared language meanings construed as ICGs? Aren't both just sets of presupposed information? What does the fact that the assumptions are a matter of common ground consist in (perhaps an explicit comparison with Lewis would've helped), and what does it really add?

Contrast the much more common, social order of explanation shared by philosophers from Dummett to Burge to Kaplan. That view starts with the notion of public language as a historically embedded social practice. Public language meanings are thought to be importantly different from anything an individual's words could possess on their own, usually having to do with their normativity. On a socialized version of a Richard-style view, the ICG could be understood in terms not of assumptions that speakers in fact make, are disposed to make, or that it is conventionally regular to make, but that one is required to make, to speak correctly. How does Richard's view of ICG compare to this normative alternative?

Consider the other side of the coin, competence in the shared language. Richard says that to be a competent speaker of a shared language one must have the "right sort of cognitive contact" (68) with the ICG. What is it to possess that? The simplest view is that it is to make the right assumptions. But Richard acknowledges that this is not necessary. If Ruben is fanatical about cousins and thinks that only men can be cousins then he is not assuming "C: cousins are parents' siblings' progeny" (69). But that doesn't bar him from being competent with 'cousin'. As Richard puts it: "To understand a word, it suffices to know how it's supposed to be used; knowing that doesn't require that one use that word in that way." (69) On a social view you would cash out 'supposed' in terms of knowing the rule you have to follow to speak correctly. However, despite some off-hand references to rules of use (17, 87), Richard tells us in a footnote that he doesn't think there are any such rules but just regularities in use (157). The force of 'supposed' is instead to be understood in terms of Ruben making a yet-another assumption, a higher-order one: "D: Speakers who use 'cousin' expect their audience to recognize that in using the word they presuppose C" (69). Since individuals presumably wouldn't make such higher-order assumptions without being embedded in the group, this is where Richard's view goes beyond mere overlap of uses and becomes genuinely social, while stopping short of normativity.

It's an interesting proposal, but as you can see, piecing it together takes some interpretive work and one would have wished for a more explicit discussion of the details vis-à-vis established alternatives in terms of Lewisian conventions and social rules.


Meanings are like species in how they change. Species are population lineages, collections of individuals diachronically related by descent and synchronically related by "some species-making relation" (98). What sorts of linguistic entities are supposed to be analogous collections or individuals? Again, Richard starts from individuals' lexicons and the words they contain. The lexical entries are individuals with a history. My 'cousin' is mine and yours is yours, but each was acquired in some way, usually from other people. The word 'cousin' in the shared language is a collection of these entries and thus it also has a history. The same goes for its meaning. I have my use and you have yours. The meaning qua ICG of 'cousin' in the shared language of some group is a collection of these uses and has a history as well. Thus, both the words themselves and their meanings are constituted by collections of individuals and have a history. They are species-like in two respects. First, there can be some acceptable variation in the individual lexical entries (e.g., pronunciation, ICG) while these still constitute the same word (100). Second, they can gradually change some of their properties over time while not ceasing to exist. This brings us to our final topic.

Meaning Change and Referentialism

Meanings are like species in how they change. One sort of meaning change is a matter of a word losing its old meaning and acquiring a new one. For example, 'meat' used to mean 'solid food', but now means something like 'animal flesh eaten as food'. This is the type that comes with change of topic or subject. In the past, we used the word to talk about one thing; now it has changed its meaning and we use it to talk about something different. Richard calls this change of meaning. However, he also wants to make room for the possibility of meaning change that allows retention of topic -- change in meaning (106).

I hinted above at a view that would separate the properly linguistic or meaning-related (e.g., 'lumi' is used to refer to snow) and the conceptual (the concept snow) (compare Glanzberg 2018). On such a view it would be natural to think that the only sort of meaning change is change of meaning, and any putative change in meaning is really change in concepts or something further. This is not how Richard thinks of things since he equates meanings and concepts qua ICGs. On his view, there can be change in meaning since some of the rich descriptive claims that are part of an ICG can be shed and new ones added, without the topic changing.

What does it take for there to be no change of meaning despite changes in meaning? In other words, when does meaning stay the same? Richard considers, and argues against, a view he dubs Referentialism, which holds that sameness of meaning/concept over time can be understood in terms of sameness of reference. Take 'pasta' in the mouth of English-speakers in the mid-19th century when it was thought that pasta is necessarily made of wheat, compared to 'pasta' in the mouth of English-speakers today who think that pasta can also be made out of rice, seaweed, etc. Richard wants to say that there has been no change of meaning in 'pasta', but there has been change in meaning/concept qua ICG. However, he also claims that there has been a change of reference. To my ear, this sounds bizarre. If there's been just change in meaning, which is supposed to come with retention of topic, how could reference have changed? Doesn't topic = reference = the kind of foodstuff, pasta? But what Richard has in mind instead is that 'pasta' has changed its extension; it now applies to a lot more than it did before. But this makes the argument against Referentialism feel a bit strawmanish. Referentialists, among whom Richard seems to include Soames, think that sameness of meaning over time = sameness of topic over time, but presumably they wouldn't think that this is a matter of mere sameness of extension. Extension obviously changes over time for all sorts of reasons that have nothing to do with meaning.

One might go further and doubt most of Richard's claims about changes in meaning or concept. Richard seems to think that it's obvious that 'marry' has recently undergone a change in meaning because more and more people now think that people of the same sex can marry. To me, this seems false. I don't think the requirements for specifically linguistic competence with the English word 'marry' have changed one bit between 1900 and now. But let's get to more neutral ground and ask whether even "the" concept marriage has changed. Why think this, rather than thinking that the only things that have changed over time, and that can differ wildly between different people, are the associated conceptions, sets of beliefs or presuppositions about the topic? Richard doesn't tell us, but I think many people will find this the most crucial question facing the meaning/concept = ICG picture.

I hope that the above has left you with the impression that this book contains a fresh and exciting, if a bit raw and underdeveloped, perspective on a number of topics related to meaning, concepts, and how they change. It can be profitably read and reflected on for a long time. It is Richard's first step in a new, more foundational direction, and we can only eagerly await his next words on the subject.


Thanks to Alex Grzankowski, Eliot Michaelson, and Elmar Geir Unnsteinsson for comments and discussion.


Davidson, D. 1986. "A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs". Truth and Interpretation: Perspectives on the Philosophy of Donald Davidson. Ed. E. Lepore. Cambridge: Blackwell, pp. 433-446.

Glanzberg, M. 2018. "Lexical Meaning, Concepts, and the Metasemantics of Predicates". The Science of Meaning. Ed. B. Ball, B. Rabern. Oxford: Oxford University Press, pp. 197-225.

Kaplan, D. MS. "The Meaning of 'Ouch' and 'Oops'".

Lewis, D. 1975. "Languages and Language". Minnesota Studies in the Philosophy of Science. Ed. K. Gunderson. Minnesota: University of Minnesota Press, pp. 3-35.