Means, Ends, and Persons: The Meaning and Psychological Dimensions of Kant's Humanity Formula

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Robert Audi, Means, Ends, and Persons: The Meaning and Psychological Dimensions of Kant's Humanity Formula, Oxford University Press, 2016, 172pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190251550.

Reviewed by Kenneth Walden, Dartmouth College


Depending on how you count, there are between three and 92 formulations of the Categorical Imperative in Kant's Groundwork. One can make a convincing case that the most useful of these for ethical theorists is the Formula of Humanity: "Act so that you use humanity, as much in your own person as in the person of every other, always at the same time as end and never merely as means." (4:429)

To most ears this sounds better and certainly more practicable than Kant's first formulation. We all recognize the complaint in "you used me" even if we don't see the problem with acting on a maxim whose universalization cannot be willed.

And yet on closer inspection, the Formula of Humanity raises just as many questions. What is it to use someone "merely as a means"? Do I use my bus driver merely as a means every morning? And what is it to treat someone "as an end" ("in themselves")? Do I have to somehow make them the object of all my endeavors? How would that work? More skeptically, I might wonder, what reason do I have to follow such a formula? Why is your humanity an end rather than a mere means? And why should I think that this is a fundamental principle of morality? Even if I agree that using you as a mere means is morally wrong, I might think that such wrongs populate a small principality on the moral map.

Kant's own answers to these questions are embedded in a hulking philosophical apparatus: an argument about the conditions of valuing, the positing of the autonomy of persons, a special kind of regard, Achtung, a distinction between dignity and price, and the moral ideal of a Realm of Ends. Robert Audi's new book tries to answer some of the central questions about Kant's formula at significant remove from his machinery. The result is a fresh and interesting look at an important part of Kantian ethics.

Audi's distance from both Kant's philosophical system and recent literature in Kantian ethics is the source of the book's significant strengths and its limitations. It offers a thoughtful and rigorous account of what it is to treat someone as a mere means and as an end. This account relies on Audi's own (straightforward and plausible) moral psychology rather than on Kant's, which allows him to make illuminating connections to other parts of ethical theory, especially those that emphasize character. On the other hand, Audi's glancing treatment of some foundational questions about the Formula -- why, for example, it has any claim on us -- and his idiosyncratic answers to others left me less than fully persuaded.

The book has eight chapters divided into two parts. The first part is given over to an analysis of treating persons merely as a means, the second to treating them as ends.

Audi begins with a distinction between treating someone solely as a means and treating them merely as a means. I may treat my bus driver solely as a means to getting to work, but if he clutched his chest and gasped, an inclination to help would probably be aroused in me. To treat someone merely as a means, by contrast, is to be bereft of concern for them -- aside from their usefulness as an instrument. Audi's principal goal in the first part of the book is to argue that we cannot make out this crucial distinction unless we attend to three features of our conduct: the particular acts that affect another person, the reasons for which we act, and the way our acts are performed (cruelly, generously).

This argument is an important corrective to simplistic readings of the prohibition on treatment as a mere means, and Audi makes it deftly. One could quibble with particular claims, but I want to pose a more general question about the approach he takes.

As I was reading these chapters, I found myself somewhat unsure about the rules of the game. Kant traces the force of the prohibition on treating others merely as means back to the demands of practical reason. So for him the question of the content of this prohibition would presumably lead us to the same place. This is obviously not how Audi conceives of his project -- he is not interpreting or retracing Kant's argument -- but I was less sure what constraints and aspirations do guide him.

Early on he says that he wants to show that "treating someone merely as a means can be explicated in a non-valuational -- roughly 'descriptive' -- way." (p. 4) But later, when discussing the difference between treating someone solely and merely as a means, he insists that "'merely' has a derogatory element we must capture." (p. 20) And in fleshing out his account, he helps himself to normative vocabulary. For example, if I am treating a person solely-but-not-merely-as-a-means, I will probably have "the normal friendly desires which, though not motivating my behavior at the time, are easily manifested". (p. 30) I presume that only friendly -- and not dastardly -- desires do the trick here.

Audi summarizes his analysis thus:

treating a person merely as a means is doing something toward that person (1) on the basis of instrumental motivation, i.e., in order to realize a further end (in this case one to which the person is seen as instrumental), (2) with no motivational concern, and a disposition not to acquire such a concern, regarding any non-instrumental aspects of the action(s), and (typically) (3) in the absence of certain kinds of constraints. (p. 38)

While it's true that none of these criteria are manifestly "valuational", Audi does rely on normative judgments in unpacking and explicating each of them. Criterion (2) mentions a lack of "motivational concern", but what this lack comes to seems best expressed with thick evaluative concepts like callousness, cold-bloodedness, and negligence. Similarly, the "certain kinds" of constraints mentioned in (3) will presumably include moral constraints like non-injury, justice, veracity, and fidelity (p. 42) but not the house rules of the Club de Sade. So while the letter of Audi's analysis is non-valuational, I think that we do have to rely on value-laden judgments, including moral judgments, in fashioning a serviceable articulation of it.

The same is true of Audi's explanation of why it is wrong to treat persons merely as means. He considers the case of a man who treats another's wound only to gain his trust so he might defraud him later. This conduct is prima facie wrong "partly because of the reprehensible state of character" it manifests -- a state which is "bad in itself" -- and also because it "exposes the person so treated to a risk of harm." (p. 59)

These observations are not necessarily objections, but I do think they raise a question. Unlike Kant, Audi is happy to rely on substantive judgments, moral and otherwise, in articulating, applying, and explaining his analysis. Kant comes to the Formula of Humanity from the claim that principles of practical reason have both form and matter. The Formula of Universal Law expresses a constraint on form. The Formula of Humanity has authority because there is a single matter, an end, "whose existence in itself ha[s] an absolute worth, something that, as end in itself, [can] be a ground of determinate laws." (4:428) That something is humanity. So given this view about practical reason, it's clear enough why Kant thinks the prohibition on treating humanity merely as means is a genuinely fundamental part of morality. But if we don't have Kant's ambitions -- if we are happy to call on considered judgments about which states of character are reprehensible and the badness of harm -- then it's less obvious why this category should interest us so much. What, in other words, does the category of treating-merely-as-a-means add to the common sense morality that Audi ends up turning to in the explication of that category? There are good answers to this question: perhaps the category enriches the explanatory powers of our extant ethical theory by carving out a distinctive kind of transgression. I suspect that this is Audi's position but would've appreciated a more explicit discussion.

The second part of the book is devoted to an analysis of treating persons as ends. There are two basic ways of understanding this notion. One is teleological: treating others as ends is (in the first instance) a matter of promoting some property of theirs. The other is recognitional: treating others as ends is a matter of recognizing their standing in some activity. (Darwall 2006)

Audi doesn't make this distinction, but I think he falls squarely on the teleological side of it. (Indeed, he doesn't acknowledge the possibility of recognitional views except for a brief footnote mentioning Darwall in the introduction.) Treating someone as end, he says, "entails treating the person in a way that is governed, and to some extent motivated, by caring about the good of the person (1) for its own sake (hence non-instrumentally) and (2) under some objectively satisfactory description of that good." (p. 85)

I find this conception difficult to square with Kant's own words. For Kant treating someone as an end involves seeing them as having a very special kind of value and for that reason meriting a distinctive form of regard. Persons have a dignity by which they "exact" respect (Metaphysics of Morals 6:435). The guise under which we are to respect persons is that of free legislator of universal law, which suggests that respect for them amounts to a recognition of their authority to make such laws (4:431). For Audi, by contrast, to treat someone as an end is not so much to recognize their standing as universal lawgivers, but to care about their good. In light of passages like these, I am inclined to think that such a stance is less a recognition of a person's dignity, and more the setting of a very high price on the promotion of their good.

To be fair, Audi does bring some aspects of the recognitional approach back into the fold when he acknowledges that a person's autonomy is "an aspect of their good" (p. 120) and that "Respecting you as a person implies an appropriate concern for your point of view". (p. 124) This leads him to a discussion of the relationship between a person's good and their conception of it and to the particular question of what role consent plays in treating others as ends. He believes that these things do matter to whether some conduct qualifies as treating someone as an end, but none of the familiar ways of cashing out how exactly they might matter -- idealized preferences, hypothetical consent -- are successful. I found this stretch of the argument frustrating for two reasons. First, Audi does not entertain the possibility that autonomy and consent may be morally significant in themselves, beyond what they contribute to a person's good. Those attracted to a recognitional model of the Formula of Humanity will find this an awkward way to think about autonomy and consent and, consequently, see a significant hole in Audi's argument. Second, Audi's engagement with other authors is spotty. His treatment of Christine M. Korsgaard (1996) and Onora O'Neill's (1989) influential attempts to articulate a consent-based reading of the Formula of Humanity is very brief, and he doesn't discuss Japa Pallikkathayil's (2010) important critique of those readings at all. This is one of the most interesting parts of the literature on the Formula of Humanity, and I wish Audi had said more about it.

Some of my concerns with Audi's gloss will be very little skin off his nose, since he's not primarily interested in interpretation. He's out to construct a theory of Kantian inspiration that is plausible on its own terms. So let's examine the view in that light. A useful way to do this is to compare the view to consequentialism. Given Audi's teleological characterization of treating persons as ends, we might expect him to understand the duty to treat persons as ends as a form of consequentialism. But he doesn't. His view is non-consequentialist, he says, because it would have us promote not an impersonal good of which the good of individuals are parts, but the personal good of each person (pp. 110-4). Thus whereas consequentialism views persons as "interchangeable", an ethics based on treating persons as ends would have us view them in a "particularized" way and advance the good of each individually.

Audi's reason for preferring an ethics of treating persons as ends over consequentialism is that it offers greater protection for the moral rights of individuals. The protections afforded by consequentialism are only "contingent". This may be so, but Audi's argument doesn't take us all the way to that conclusion. As he acknowledges in a footnote at the end of the argument, "There may be forms of rule-consequentialism that can plausibly be taken to avoid this result." (p. 114) I also wonder whether these protections go far enough. While I cannot legitimately use one person to promote another's good, I don't see anything in Audi's theory that forbids using a person to promote his or her own good. This is worrisome. Some forms of coercive beneficence may be morally permissible, but surely some are not. I cannot chain you to a chair and force you to watch The Big Lebowski even if, as a matter of fact, I know the film is so terrific that you would be better off all things considered (i.e. in spite of the violation of your autonomy, etc.).

There are also more basic questions about how such a position works and why one would adopt it. Why should someone side with Audi against the consequentialist and believe that personal good does not aggregate across persons? On a recognitional gloss of the Formula of Humanity, there is a straightforward (if controversial) answer: comparison is anathema to the attitude of respect. (Velleman 2006) On the teleological reading, however, it's not clear why, given that we are interested in promoting the goodness of persons, we shouldn't promote it in aggregate. Second, if the goodness of persons does not aggregate, how are we to handle competing claims and interests? If I face a choice between saving two persons or one, and I have the goal of treating them all as ends, what should I do? Without answers to these questions, it's hard to make a fair comparison between Audi's proposal and the varieties of consequentialism.

Audi pursues his discussion of the Formula of Humanity with unstinting care and philosophical ingenuity. Through well-chosen examples and patient exposition he develops a moral psychology that throws light on what it takes to live up to the principle. And while I found myself in disagreement with him on several points and occasionally bemused by the ways he develops Kant in not-so-Kantian ways, I think the effort to expound the Formula of Humanity in a way that exemplifies its relevance to the greater world of ethical theory is a success.


Thanks to Timothy Rosenkoetter for helpful comments and discussion.


Darwall, Stephen. 2006. The Second-Person Standpoint (Harvard University Press).

Korsgaard, Christine M. 1996. Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge University Press).

O'Neill, Onora. 1989. "Between consenting adults" in Constructions of Reason (Cambridge University Press).

Pallikkathayil, Japa. 2010. "Deriving Morality from Politics: Rethinking the Formula of Humanity", Ethics 121(1): 116-147.

Velleman, J. David. 2006. "Love as a moral emotion" in Self to Self (Cambridge University Press).