Measuring Justice: Primary Goods and Capabilities

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Harry Brighouse and Ingrid Robeyns (eds.), Measuring Justice: Primary Goods and Capabilities, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 257pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521711470.

Reviewed by Cara Nine, University College Cork


This volume brings together state-of-the art essays on the debate between primary goods (or resourcist) and capabilities theories of justice.

Essays by Thomas Pogge and Erin Kelly lead the defence of the primary goods approach generally considered, and essays by Elizabeth Anderson and Richard Arneson argue in support of the capabilities approach. The volume contains five applied essays, which lend much-needed context to the debate. Norman Daniels argues that his opportunities approach to justice regarding health, originally written as an extension of Rawlsian primary goods theory, is largely compatible with capabilities theory. Lorella Terzi engages the central topic of disability in her essay. Not surprisingly, regarding the just treatment of disabled persons, she supports a capabilities metric of justice as a 'more promising, and to a certain extent, more just scheme' than a metric based on primary goods. (This position is not surprising, because the capability approach has been designed, to a certain extent, to deal with issues of justice surrounding differently-abled persons.)

The just treatment of children is addressed by Colin Macleod, who argues that neither the primary goods nor the capabilities approach adequately accounts for justice towards children, because both accounts rely on an account of human agency that is insensitive to the intrinsic goods of childhood. Macleod does not suggest that these are irreparable problems for either account, but rather that these accounts must re-think the primary role that assumptions regarding adult human agency play in the respective theories. Harry Brighouse and Elaine Unterhalter offer a soundly commonsensical approach to educational policy. Like Macleod, they argue that neither primary goods theory nor capabilities theory can independently determine the content of educational opportunities. Instead, the authors conclude that both theories can be jointly informative while acknowledging that more theoretical tools should be utilized. Ingrid Robeyns analyzes the two approaches through their application to gender inequalities. In her essay, she highlights the benefits and obstacles of each of the approaches applied to the case of gender. Finally, Robeyns proposes that a capability theory can better meet the challenges of assessing gender justice, if it is supplemented with certain principles.

The volume is appropriately concluded by Amartya Sen, who brings to the book an insightful, broad perspective on the debate. Sen's addition serves as a book review in itself, describing and assessing the volume as a whole and philosophically engaging with several of the pieces individually. In order to avoid redundancy with Sen's skilful review, I self-consciously take on the perspective of a political philosopher, but not as an expert on the intricacies of this debate. (This is a true description of my orientation to the topic.) A reader entrenched in the debate already will find Sen's review more helpful, perhaps. Indeed, this book itself is aimed at that expert audience.

My first expectation of this volume is that it tells me the difference between the primary goods approach and the capabilities approach. The difference is far from clear and seems to face two problems. First, each approach utilizes the other to a large extent. Second, different authors seem to characterize the views differently; one author's primary goods approach looks very little like another's.

However, Robeyns and Brighouse capture the distinction well, or as well as possible in their introduction. Political philosophy asks the question: 'What should we look at, when evaluating whether one state of affairs is more or less just than another?' That is, 'What is the metric of justice?'

On the primary goods approach, the metric of justice is the goods that one receives from the particular arrangement of social, political, and economic institutions. This approach, pioneered by John Rawls, measures the means (primary goods) for the individual achievement of a good life, while not looking closely at individuals' heterogeneous desires or abilities. By contrast, on the capabilities approach, the metric of justice is the ends. A 'capability' is the ability and opportunity that a person has to convert resources into a means to promote her needs and/or interests. The capabilities approach focuses on freedom and functioning. A functioning is the 'actual living' that a person is able to achieve. Yet the capabilities approach goes beyond a look at functioning and "also reflects the intuition that what matters is not merely achieving the functioning but being free to achieve it" (p. 2).

In simple terms, the distinction between the capabilities approach and the primary goods approach is that capability theorists focus on the ends (heterogeneous individual capabilities) as a measure of justice, while primary goods theorists focus on the means (fair distribution of resources) as a measure of justice. Not surprisingly, this distinction quickly blurs as soon as one delves into the actual workings of a theory of justice. We can hardly discuss the ends without worrying about the means, and vice versa. The more one reads of the debate between the two approaches, the more it seems that the two approaches cannot dispense with one another. For example, Anderson offers a capabilities solution to the problem of unjust stigmas and stereotypes. A capabilities approach, she says,

focuses on the ways informal social norms and expectations affect the ability of individuals to convert their resources into functionings that have democratic import … [it] can both recognize these injustices and suggest nonresourcist remedies. For example, public school curricula and student socialization policies can be revised to stress the importance of tolerance and cooperation across difference, and undermine false stereotypes about gays and lesbians, women, the disabled, blacks, Muslims, and other disadvantaged groups. Public institutions can also design affirmative action programs not merely to compensate victims for unjust resource deprivations, but to facilitate informal intergroup socialization and cooperation. (p. 90)

Despite Anderson naming it otherwise, it appears that this is a resourcist solution to a problem identified by a capabilities approach. In the example, public policies (by school officials or other institutions) address problems of political inequality. The use of public policies to create opportunities is a resourcist solution. Anderson argues that her solution is an indirect solution, and therefore not resourcist. However, it is hard to know what she has in mind here as the distinction between direct and indirect, and why a resourcist can't make use of both direct and indirect uses of resources to create more just institutions. Limiting the resourcist to only direct solutions seems to arbitrarily and needlessly hobble the primary goods theory.

In what seems like a contrast to Anderson's capabilities approach, the primary goods (or resourcist) approach is open to sharing theoretical space with capabilities. In his essay defending the resourcist approach, Pogge states, "an account of human capabilities can also play an important and evidentiary role [in a theory of justice]. The observed fact that many persons are lacking certain vital functionings may be good reason to revise our resourcist criterion of social justice" (p. 50). He continues, "Resources do not, after all, figure as the ultimate ends in human lives, but as a means for meeting human needs and, ultimately, for pursuing all the diverse ends that persons may set themselves" (p. 51). On this reading, capabilities and primary goods approaches do not appear to be alternative theories; rather, they are complementary parts of a larger theory of justice. However, there are still important differences between the two approaches to justice.

Pogge locates one important difference between the two approaches in their conceptions of inequality. While both approaches must account for the natural diversity between persons, according to Pogge, each approach has a different take on which natural diversity counts as inequality requiring distributive address. Under a capabilities view, any feature (natural or otherwise) that affects a person's capabilities is a relevant feature for theories of justice. The measure of justice on this view is the person's ability and freedom to achieve certain functionings. What matters is that obstacles to individual functioning are removed and opportunities to function are in place. On the primary goods view, by contrast, only a certain set of natural differences are relevant from the perspective of justice -- those differences that are disadvantaged by social arrangements. On this view, natural diversity becomes inequality only when manmade institutions treat persons with certain natural endowments unequally. This inequality should be addressed and/or compensated by social institutions. If an individual has a feature (such as a disability) that is disadvantaged by the social arrangements such that the individual has unequal opportunities to advance their ends, then the social arrangements should be changed to correct for this inequality.

Throughout the readings, it struck me that the above difference identified by Pogge and two other differences were important to the debate between capabilities and primary goods, or resourcist, theories. First, the resourcist approach deals first with the question of what is a fair share of goods, and then distributes that fair share to persons. In contrast, the capabilities approach deals first with what is necessary for human functioning, and then demands that each person be given the means to achieve that functioning. As Anderson points out, because of this difference, the resourcist approach will have a harder time identifying and correcting for inequalities. Because of the resourcist focus on goods, the theory cannot directly show concern for individual heterogeneity. Rather, according to Anderson's interpretation of the resourcist approach, "everyone is entitled to access to a standardized package of resources, unadjusted for individual variations in their needs and endowments" (p. 92). She illustrates with an example of disabled parking spaces. Disabled parking spaces are

wider than usual, to provide room to unfold a wheelchair next to the car door. Disabled persons have a just complaint against lots that lack such parking spaces: like buildings that lack wheelchair ramps, they are based on a biased conception of human needs and endowments, tailored to the fully ambulatory. Yet their claim cannot be accommodated by devising an 'unbiased' parking space, and then including that type of space in the standardized package of resources to which all are entitled to access, disregarding individual variations in need and endowment. (p. 92)

This is an extreme example, and I don't see any reason why a resourcist would accept that this is a consequence of her theory. One can have a conception of a standardized parking lot, without the conception of standardized parking spaces. The former would include spaces to meet the needs of most individuals represented in society. Some of the parking spaces would be larger to accommodate the needs of certain members of society, and most of the spaces would be smaller to meet the needs of others. The level at which standardization occurs (parking lot vs. parking space, e.g.) could allow for a great deal of customization for individual heterogeneity. A standardized place of business could include customization for the individuals who work or are expected to work in that place as part of its 'standard' package. For instance, as part of a 'standardized place of business' some resources could be set aside at each place of business to provide for relevant modifications when those became necessary for particular individuals.

However, I take Anderson's point to be that the provision of standardized sets of resources will never be as sensitive to the heterogeneous needs of individuals as the provision of means to individuals under a capability theory. This seems true, even if standardized sets can be customized.

Second, the resourcist approach is inherently entrenched in questions of the scope of political obligation and ownership, while the capability approach is not. The capability approach first examines the kinds of functionings that individuals are free and able to achieve. The duties that others have regarding these capabilities may be generated by moral as well as by political considerations. Regarding the capabilities of my daughter, I may have certain obligations. In traditional terms, this is not a political obligation toward my daughter; rather it is a moral one. The capability theorist may wish to limit duties generated by concern for capabilities to the political realm only -- but there is no inherent reason that this need be the case. In fact, that the theory reaches beyond the realm of traditional political obligations may be attractive for some. Robeyns seems to argue this point with regards to gender justice in the conclusion of her essay,

Gender justice can never appropriately be dealt with when justice is understood as only a political conception of justice, but needs to include the full scope of human life, including injustice in the family and the reproduction of injustice-generating social norms, also those (re-) produced with the Rawlsian 'voluntary associations' … the scope of Rawlsian justice is a serious limitation for the analysis of gender injustice. (p. 232)

The resourcist, by contrast, must deal directly with questions of the scope of political obligation and property. They examine first the division of particular goods among particular people. Inseparable from this investigation are the queries: (1) What particular goods are up for distribution, (2) which agents have an expectation regarding the distribution of those particular goods, and (3) what is the normative relationship between a particular good and an agent's legitimate expectation regarding that particular good. Answering the question of whether goods are distributed fairly will depend on which particular goods are available for distribution, which particular agents should be included in the distribution of those goods, and the normative relationship (individual property rights or collective resource rights) that agents have with the particular goods. For example, one society (e.g., Kuwait) has a set of legitimate expectations regarding their natural resources, and it is not legitimate (or at least it may not be legitimate) for the same set of expectations regarding the resources within Kuwaiti territory to be held by others (e.g., Iraq). If we ask whether goods are distributed justly in Iraq, we assume that we have prior knowledge of which particular goods are being assessed and that the relevant scope of distribution is to Iraqis. If the particular goods up for distribution are misidentified, or the scope inclusive of more persons, then the assessment of fairness could possibly be quite different. Questions of ownership and the scope of political obligation must be examined prior to the resourcist evaluation of justice in the distribution of goods.

I don't mean to say that these questions of ownership and scope are not important for the capability theorist; they are. However, it seems possible for a capability theorist to assess the justice of a situation prior to engaging these questions. The same is not true for a primary goods, or resourcist, theorist. The resourcist must address these questions prior to her assessment of the fair distribution of goods. This is not a criticism of the resourcist approach. I only mean to highlight what I see as a major difference between the approaches, especially in their application to global justice theory.

This volume on primary goods and capabilities theory pushes forward a debate on the foundations of justice. Needless to say, the foundation of justice is a wide and complicated topic, and many interesting and important issues will be left out of any one volume. The editors have done an excellent job collecting essays on a central debate in liberal political theory. In this review I have discussed mainly the abstract theoretical work. A benefit of this collection is its dedication to applied theory, which helps to clarify and deepen theoretical considerations. I recommend the volume for anybody interested in the intricacies of the debate between capability and primary goods approaches.