Mechanism and Causality in Biology and Economics

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Hsiang-Ke Chao, Szu-Ting Chen, and Roberta L. Millstein (eds.), Mechanism and Causality in Biology and Economics, Springer, 2013, 256pp., $179.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789400724532.

Reviewed by Anya Plutynski, Washington University in St. Louis


The last ten years have seen a significant increase of interest in causality and mechanism in biology and economics. Chao, Chen and Millstein’s collection of excellent essays provides both a critical reappraisal of how far we’ve come, and an insight into future lines of inquiry. One of the many good things about the book is the integration of diverse new work by young scholars with that of more senior contributors to the field. Another is the novel subject matter: one of my criteria for a good read in philosophy is that I learn something new, and this book met that criterion in spades. I enjoyed learning so many new things about such a diversity of topics -- everything from the (purported) links between the legalization of abortion and reduction of crime, to mechanisms involved in cystic fibrosis, to the million missing women question in China. Another criterion is that a book gets me thinking, either by forcing me away from settled views, or deepening my understanding of a debate. This book met that criterion as well: it balanced nicely a variety of case studies and more theoretically oriented papers on causation, mechanisms, and laws, all of which challenged me to think in new ways about these longstanding problems.

The editors frame their project as part of the methodological and naturalist approach in philosophy of science, according to which one ought to examine actual scientific practice in inquiring into the objectives, methods, criteria of evaluation and role of values in science. And this is what we find. Each essay draws upon both empirical and methodological practices in biology, biomedicine, and economics. How the case studies inform each author’s arguments and conclusions varies. Some essays are more top down in spirit -- concerned with questions that might be said to fall into the category of general philosophy of science. For example, Kevin Hoover gives an illuminating explication and defense of a structural account of causation, though one that drew upon both methodological tools and examples from economics. Others are more bottom up: e.g., Lindley Darden gives a detailed description of exactly how the mechanisms leading to cystic fibrosis were identified, using this example to illustrate how causal knowledge is refined and improved upon with mechanistic understanding. This counterpoint is refreshing: one gets a sense for both the diversity of approaches to explicating how causal and mechanistic knowledge is achieved in science, and an illustration of how biology and economics can jointly (but in rather different ways) shed new light on long-standing problems in philosophy of science.

While it may seem odd at first pass to link such distinct disciplines as economics and biology in a single volume, as the essays illustrate, the increasing frequency with which biologists and economists appear to be sharing concepts and tools provides an opportunity for philosophical exchange. Both fields of study concern historically contingent, chancy, and population level events and processes, and both raise interesting questions about extrapolation, causality and multi-level investigation. For instance, Daniel Steel provides an illuminating analysis of the ways in which social scientists extrapolate from different bodies of evidence, and move back and forth between mechanistic reasoning and higher-level evidence of probabilistic association in establishing a causal link between the legalization of abortion in the U.S. in 1973, and reduction of crime in the 1990s.

The book is nicely organized into four sections: on defining mechanism and causality (and explicating the relation between the two), on models and representation, on reconsidering biological mechanisms and causality, and finally, on bridging the boundaries between biology and economics (and problems surrounding extrapolation of methods and concepts from one field to another). It should thus be of interest both to those with interests in general philosophy of science, and those with interests in interdisciplinary links among the special sciences.

The essays make up an interesting mix; there is no single unified thesis, but a variety of views, some of which occupy extremes along a continuum of views about the centrality of mechanisms to scientific understanding, and the relationship between causal and mechanistic claims in the sciences. The authors defend the following views: (1) mechanistic knowledge is central to prediction, control and explanation in the biomedical sciences, and more useful than abstract causal understanding; (2) the structuralist account of causation better resolves debates about causal structure, identity of causes, causal independence, and modularity, than the manipulationist account; (3) the loss of mathematical molding is regrettable, insofar as it played an important role in both discovery and testing hypotheses about mechanisms in econometrics; (4) the replicator dynamic models as deployed in economics and biology are not representing a mechanism; (5) experimental discoveries may be made independent of theories; (6) contra Bert Leuridians claim that mechanisms cannot replace laws, mechanistic approaches in philosophy of biology better resolve questions about explanation, manipulation, and prediction than nomic approaches; (7) natural selection does exhibit causal production at the population level; (8) taking different perspectives on natural selection and the causes in operation in selection meets different explanatory needs, and we may regard natural selection to be a population-level causal process, provided certain solutions to the problems of epiphenomenalism and overdetermination are addressed; (9) different causal claims are at stake in an extrapolation, and these differences matter to assessment of its warrant; (10) there are no good reasons to regard randomization as a sine qua non in either biomedicine or economics; and finally, (11) a complimentary method is to be preferred to a substitutive one in providing a more complete picture of causation in such contexts as the missing women case in China.

In short, the volume covers a lot of territory, and while the themes are consistent, the authors' examples, approaches and conclusions were not. I take this to be one of the strengths of the volume: reading it is like listening in on a conversation among amicable but not always like-minded peers. Some authors place a good deal of emphasis on the utility of the mechanistic perspective in addressing core problems in philosophy of science (Darden, Carl Craver and Marie Kaiser, Steel); others see mechanism as less central to characterizing scientific explanation, method, or discovery, at least in some domains (Till Grüne-Yanoff, David Teirra and Julian Reiss). While the dividing lines are not always so sharp, one can draw some rough and general conclusions: while thinking in terms of mechanisms can be enormously important, especially in applied contexts where concerns of intervention and control dominate, there are a wide array of open philosophical questions about how we use formal models in representing dynamical behavior, what kinds of statistical tools are best at assessing causal relationships, and when we have a causal relation in general that may or may not avail itself of mechanistic thinking. It seems that when and why thinking in terms of mechanism is of use is a very context specific matter.

To illustrate this conclusion, I will consider two key papers in the volume: Millstein’s piece, "Natural Selection and Causal Productivity," and Rong-Lin Wang's, "Is Natural Selection a Population-Level Causal Process?" Millstein argues (persuasively, in my view), that natural selection is a population level causal process. Her argument is a reply to Stuart Glennan, who argues ("Productivity, relevance, and natural selection," 2009) that while population level properties can be causally relevant to various outcomes, natural selection is not causally productive of changes in frequency distribution of a trait, only interactions between organisms are. Millstein's essay is a model of clarity: she briefly outline's Glennan's argument, deftly identifies how and why they part ways, and then shows why we ought to be persuaded of her view. Briefly, Glennan's argument turns on a distinction between two senses of causation: causal productivity and causal relevance. Causal productivity, according to Glennan, requires a relation between events, where events are spatio-temporally contiguous or connected by contiguous intermediates, transitive, and tied to mechanistic accounts of causation. Mechanisms, in other words, are the key element of causal production. Glennan argues that any of the various accounts of mechanism are sufficient for causal production; but, all will involve at minimum, interacting objects, parts or components. Causal relevance, in contrast, is a counterfactual relation of dependence between a fact and an event.

This pluralistic account of causation allows Glennan to accommodate problems with the counterfactual account like overdetermination, and problems with the production account, like apparent causation by absence. Thus, while overdetermination cases (e.g., the hole in the canteen, plus the poisoning of its contents) seem to fail the counterfactual test, they will nonetheless count as causes, because they satisfy the production criterion. And, causation by absence, e.g., failure to turn off the hose will count as causally relevant, if not causally productive, of the basement flooding. Glennan argues that population level properties do not cause change in the production sense, because populations are not spatiotemporally contiguous entities. However, he does grant that facts about population level properties can be causally relevant to outcomes like changes in trait distribution. For Glennan, full understanding requires an account of both relevant and productive causes. Thus, to explain the changes in a distribution of traits due to selection, in Glennan's view, one must describe both the relevant population level facts, and the productive, mechanistic interactions between organisms and their environments.

Millstein disagrees, but she is very careful to sidestep the question of causal pluralism vs. monism, as well as Glennan's conception of scientific understanding and explanation: wise moves. Her point is very simple: even if we grant Glennan's account of causation, populations can count as productive causes. Here’s how: populations are individual objects, at least by Ghiselin-Hull's criteria of individuality: they are spatiotemporal particulars, integrated to the extent that the survival and reproductive interactions of its constituent members have a shared fate; a population has a beginning and ending in time, but nonetheless has temporal continuity via the causal interactions among its members. She grants a variety of potential worries here about the extent of spatial and temporal integration of populations, but argues that nonetheless populations are sufficiently integrated to count as causes, on the production view.

Her argument comes in two parts: first, for selection to be in operation, singleton interactions between individual organisms will not suffice. Selection is by definition a matter of relative success of groups of individuals, given their differential fitness. It is only with respect to these group level differences that we can even speak of selection as in operation. Second, changes in the distribution of traits in a population are dependent upon earlier population level properties, in just the way Wesley Salmon spoke of mark transmission, not simply as a matter of fact, but as a matter of causal propagation. She gives a variety of examples to illustrate, but what they all share is that interactions between populations (and not simply individuals) and environments yield discriminate changes in frequency distributions. It is these population level interactions and propagation of changes in populations that are distinctive of natural selection, not the interactions between particular bugs and fish or birds and seeds. This is why, on her view, individual mechanistic interactions between particular organisms are not central to fully explaining evolution by natural selection, as Glennan seems to think. She concludes: "phenomena such as natural selection are better suited to non-decompositional, etiological accounts, rather than the constitutive decompositional accounts that the new mechanists emphasize. Sometimes, all we need is to cite causation 'at' a level." (p. 161)

What's at stake in this debate, in other words, is when we have a causal explanation at a given scale. Millstein argues that selection explanations are causal explanations; they satisfy Salmon's (as well as counterfactualist’s) tests of causation; but perhaps more importantly, to give an account of the causal processes involved in selection does not require giving an accounting of each individual interaction between the parts of the population and their environment. Put differently, decomposition and accounting of lower-level mechanistic interaction may not be explanatorily relevant to explaining phenomena at higher levels. If we are interested in population level changes, population level causes may well suffice. If, instead, we are interested in giving an account of what specific features cause an organism to be selected "for" in some specific context, perhaps the kinds of mechanistic decomposition will be relevant. This may be where Millstein's paper is nicely contrasted with Wang's, which argues that Millstein's view is incomplete.

Wang's paper makes an interesting contrast with Millstein. Wang argues that Millstein's view faces a number of challenges. For brevity, I will focus on the second one, as it serves to nicely supplement the exchange discussed above between Millstein and Glennan. Wang begins by identifying a worry about calling natural selection a cause: a worry associated with an objection from epiphenomenalism and overdetermination. The worry is this: if the many different causes of individual births and deaths in a population add up to change in trait distribution in a population, why need we invoke natural selection? Isn't natural selection just a shadow of a causal process operating at another level, or “epiphenomenal,” or, doesn’t it simply count as an overdetermining cause? The answer, he explains, is no. He uses an analogy to illustrate: if we imagine a tyrant who orders the killing of a proportion of individuals of some type in a population, and we wish to explain why that proportion was killed annually, then simply summing over the individual killings by the tyrant’s army would not suffice. We need also to appeal to the tyrant’s law: "though the many detailed causal stories . . . suffice to sum up the annual relative frequency and calculate the way the frequency changes, they do not suffice to explain causally why it changes in the way it does." (p. 179) Similarly, with respect to natural selection, while the sum of births and deaths of individual organisms in a population suffices to calculate the changes in relative frequency of some type, they do not causally explain that outcome. In this way, Millstein's view that natural selection is a population level causal process can be saved from the objection that it is mere shadow process.

While for reasons of space I cannot unpack each essay in this excellent volume, I can strongly recommend it. Each of these papers is self-contained, but together they constitute intriguingly contrasting treatments of a variety of issues to do with causation, explanation, and the roles of mechanistic understanding in economics and biology.