Mechanisms and Consciousness: Integrating Phenomenology with Cognitive Science

Mechanisms And Consciousness

Marek Pokropski, Mechanisms and Consciousness: Integrating Phenomenology with Cognitive Science, Routledge, 2022, 206pp., $160.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780367465254.

Reviewed by Dave Ward, University of Edinburgh


Phenomenology, the philosophical movement founded and baptised by Edmund Husserl in the late 19th Century, has always had a fraught relationship with the empirical sciences of the mind. Ever since there has been phenomenology, people have argued about naturalizing it. Can we? Should we? In his book, Marek Pokropski argues that the answers to these questions are ‘yes’ and ‘yes’. The questions are tricky in part because there is so little agreement about what either ‘phenomenology’ or ‘naturalization’ consist in. Pokropski makes progress by arguing for particular conceptions of both. His overarching thesis is simple and appealing—phenomenology can be productively integrated with cognitive science when we work with a de-transcendentalised ‘phenomenological psychology’, and use its analyses of mental states and processes to constrain multi-level mechanistic explanations. The book’s five main chapters build towards a case for this claim, each focusing on a different aspect of Pokropski’s overall picture.

Chapter 1 begins to articulate the conception of Husserlian ‘phenomenological psychology’ involved in Pokropski’s integrative project. On Pokropski’s construal, phenomenologists make use of a toolkit of Husserlian imaginative techniques and conceptual apparatus to deliver characterisations of psychological structures and processes; these characterisations then serve as defeasible starting points for research in the sciences of the mind. They are defeasible starting points because they can be revisited and reworked in light of empirical findings. Phenomenological reflection on temporal experience, for example, might claim to show that our rolling experience of the present moment is always tinged with a residual awareness of the immediate past, and an anticipation of the immediate future—aspects of time consciousness that Husserl calls ‘retention’ and ‘protention’. This characterisation of the structure of temporal experience can then be used to frame hypotheses, research questions and modelling strategies in various branches of cognitive science. But the results of those enquiries can also help to refine or reform the phenomenologist’s characterisations. Failure to find neurobiological substrates that could plausibly implement the psychological structures the phenomenologist has identified, or to operationalise and measure behavioural and cognitive abilities that correspond to the retentional and protentional aspects of experience might send the Pokropskian phenomenologist back to the drawing board, forcing them to reassess the reflections that motivated their initial characterisation.

Chapter 2 brings Pokropski’s way of naturalizing phenomenology into view by contrasting it with existing proposals. To naturalize phenomenology is to integrate it into cognitive scientific research and practice. Demonstrating that phenomenology is appropriately integrated with scientific practice requires a clear specification of the way in which phenomenological theorising and research in the mind sciences place robust constraints on each other. Pokropski criticizes some existing attempts to naturalise phenomenology for giving accounts of these constraining relations that are too weak, too strong, or too opaque. The popular suggestion that we can integrate phenomenological analyses of mental states and processes into cognitive scientific research merely by ‘front-loading’ them into the design and interpretation of empirical investigations is too weak. The rigorous and disciplined characterisations of psychological phenomena to which phenomenologists aspire are supposed to contrast with the folksy and intuitive characterisations one might get by asking around the nearest pub or bus stop. But the folksy characterisations are not irrelevant to our science of the mind—they give us a defeasible initial fix on the psychological phenomena we aim to understand, and could similarly be used to shape and interpret empirical research. If phenomenology is to be usefully integrated with cognitive science, its theoretical vocabulary should constrain scientific practice in some more robust or interesting way than folk psychology does. On the other hand, to require strong isomorphism or direct mapping between the phenomenologist’s description of a mental state or process and the neural or computational substrates uncovered by cognitive science would be an implausibly strong form of constraint. Substrates of dog-perceptions needn’t be dog-shaped. Whatever the relationship between phenomenological descriptions and the rest of the mind sciences, it is more complex than simple isomorphism.

What the proposals for naturalizing phenomenology rejected by Pokropski have in common is a failure to plausibly specify the relationships of constraint that should obtain between phenomenological theorising and the rest of cognitive science. Chapter 3 introduces the conception of multi-level mechanistic explanation that frames the solution Pokropski provides in the final chapters. Drawing on the influential work of ‘new mechanist’ philosophers of science, the kind of mechanistic explanation Pokropski favours aspires to provide an integrative and non-reductive account of the relationships of mutual constraint obtaining between different scientific approaches to the same subject matter. Human minds are studied by a rich weave of disciplines—neuroscientists, developmental and comparative psychologists, AI researchers and more, all working at an array of spatial, temporal and psychological scales. Rather than trying to reduce the rich diversity of explanatory vocabulary and practice found within and across these subdisciplines to a single master-language, multi-level mechanists aim to integrate them by using their contributions to constrain the shape of an overarching story of the causal structure of their explanatory target. Behavioural findings in the psychology of memory, for example, can shape the space of computational architectures investigated by modellers; findings in neurophysiology can help rule in or out candidate hypotheses about how different mnemonic capacities develop, persist, or integrate; the discovery of developmental milestones or plateaus can constrain the space of viable models at various levels. In this way, the hope is that mechanistic sketches pitched at different levels of description and granularity can reciprocally inform and improve each other, resulting in a continuous movement towards a consistent and comprehensive overarching description of the target phenomenon. The overall picture is of a vibrant conversation that progresses towards a shared consensus, but in which no one voice takes priority or has the final say.

How does phenomenology fit into this picture? Phenomenological characterisations are not directly concerned with uncovering the causal structure of the mental states and processes that are their explanatory targets, focusing instead on delivering a ‘constitutive’ understanding of psychological phenomena—telling us what mental states and processes essentially are, rather than how they work. While this means, on the mechanist model, that phenomenological claims do not qualify as scientific explanations in their own right, those claims can nonetheless constrain scientific practice by shaping the space of possible mechanisms investigated by the subdisciplines of the mind sciences. Moreover, the analyses of the kind of ‘phenomenological psychology’ Pokropski favours can be revisited and revised in light of hypotheses about underlying mechanisms. In this way, phenomenology is integrated into cognitive science via relationships of mutual constraint analogous to those that unify scientific subdisciplines in general.

Chapters 4 and 5 begin to flesh out how this might look in practice. Drawing on some passages from Ideas, Pokropski argues in Chapter 4 that we should read Husserlian phenomenology as delivering functional analyses of mental states and processes. Phenomenologists aim to reveal how different modes of intentional relation to the world are constituted by uncovering the sub-capacities on which they depend—as when, for example, the temporal structure of experience is shown to depend on retentional and protentional capacities. Whilst such functional analyses do not describe the mechanisms that implement these sub-capacities, they nonetheless constrain the space of viable mechanistic models that could implement them, and are thus apt for integration into cognitive scientific practice. Pokropski suggests that we find this explanatory structure in some recent attempts to blend phenomenology and cognitive science, such as Michael Madary’s (2017) marriage of a Husserlian analyses of the anticipatory structure of visual experience with predictive processing models in visual psychology.

Chapter 5 considers existing proposals for integrating phenomenological analyses with dynamical-mechanistic explanations. Some theorists have attempted to integrate phenomenology with cognitive science by drawing connections between phenomenological characterisations of an explanatory target and models of the target couched in the language of dynamical systems theory. The latter vocabulary characterises systems in terms of the topology of their state space, attempting to mathematically specify the stable trajectories that characterise how the behaviour of a complex system evolves over time. Some phenomenological analyses likewise attempt to identify stable patterns in the ways in which particular kinds of experience unfold over time—for example, Pokropski cites the results of Claire Petitmengin’s microphenomenological interviews which purport to uncover regularities in the character and trajectory of abnormal experiences prior to the onset of epileptic seizures. Some ‘neurophenomenologists’ argue that psychological phenomena can thus be explained via appeal to the consonance between the temporal patterns of experience identified by phenomenology and the topological structures specified by dynamical models. This fits with Pokropski’s vision of the integration of phenomenology with cognitive science insofar as the phenomenologist’s descriptions constrain the space of viable models of the dynamics of the target system. But Pokropski argues that his framework also lets us see the limitations of current neurophenomenological explanations—the simple characterisations of linear experiential trajectories that neurophenomenologists tend to provide contrast with the complex, multidimensional models of neural state-space yielded by dynamical systems neuroscience. Proper integration of phenomenology with this branch of cognitive science demands phenomenological characterisations of target phenomena that mirror the depth and complexity of the multidimensional dynamical models they aspire to constrain.

The chapters of Pokropski’s book can be read semi-independently, and could function as lucid, high-level introductions to their subject matter. Readers without prior knowledge of mechanistic explanation or Husserlian phenomenology will be brought up to speed by summaries of the main contours of those movements and their historical developments. This structure has its pros and cons. Presupposing no detailed prior knowledge of the views at issue fits with Pokropski’s inclusive and integrative aims, and the book’s modular structure allows readers to dip in and out of chapters in ways that fit their particular interests. On the ‘con’ side, this structure entails occasional repetition of material across chapters, and the presentation and defense of Pokropski’s central proposal sometimes takes a back seat to exegetical material dealing with the details of contrasting views. The book’s main achievement is to introduce Pokropski’s proposed naturalization of phenomenology as worthy of serious consideration by naturalistically-inclined phenomenologists and broad-minded mechanists. This is an important advance, moving contemporary discussion of naturalizing phenomenology forward in ways that future work on the topic will have to reckon with. But some important open questions remain about the shape and scope of Pokropski’s proposal. The prospects of Pokropski’s way of integrating phenomenology with cognitive science depend on the viability and compatibility of its constituent parts—Pokropski’s take on Husserlian philosophical psychology, and multi-level mechanistic explanation. Questions arise on each score.

First, can Pokropski’s de-transcendentalised mode of phenomenology do the work required of it—constraining mechanistic explanations in the mind sciences in some more interesting way than mere introspective reports, but without pretensions to uncover transcendentally necessary structures of experience? Pokropski wants phenomenological analyses to deliver an understanding of their targets that is ‘constitutive’, revealing the target’s essential nature, but which is still susceptible to empirical constraint and revision. Pokropski’s book is somewhat light on detail as to just how to thread this particular needle, mostly content to suggest that we find precedent for such a view in Husserl’s writing on phenomenological psychology. But we might wonder about this. Pokropski is candid about downplaying the transcendental aspect of phenomenology emphasised in works like Ideas I, where Husserl insists that the ‘pure essential truths’ at which the phenomenologist aims ‘do not make the slightest assertion concerning facts’ (§4), and that ‘eidetic [phenomenological] science excludes in principle every assimilation of the theoretical results of empirical science’ (§7). But even in the lectures on phenomenological psychology that are Pokropski’s touchstone, Husserl continues to insist that the findings of phenomenology are a priori truths about essential structures of experience. Husserl’s phenomenological psychology retains a transcendental aspect insofar as it aims to uncover ‘all those essential universalities and necessities without which psychological being and living are simply inconceivable’ (Husserl 1977, 33; quoted by Pokropski on p.21), and to do so prior to the empirical psychology that takes phenomenological analyses as its starting point. Despite their science-facing outlook, Husserl still construes the deliverances of phenomenological psychology as having an evidential weight that sits uneasily with Polropski’s vision of an ecumenical and non-hierarchical multi-level study of mind. Nonetheless, I think budding mechanistic phenomenologists have reasons for optimism here—Merleau-Ponty, who receives only a few brief mentions in Pokropski’s book, has plenty to say about the need to reject a sharp division between the empirical and the transcendental, and how the essential structures sought by an eidetic psychology can be revealed by the human sciences as well as by armchair reflection. Trying to integrate some of Merleau-Ponty’s ideas on this score into Pokropski’s project strikes me as a promising avenue for future research.

Some readers might also harbour doubts about the rosy picture of scientific integration offered by multi-level mechanistic explanation. The vision of neurobiology, AI, cognitive psychology, paleoanthropology, and the rest of the mind sciences as autonomous disciplines united by reciprocal constraints on each other’s models is undeniably appealing. But a more pessimistic view sees these subdisciplines as each investigating distinct aspects of reality, and doing so via fundamentally incompatible modelling strategies, with their own proprietary abstractions and idealisations. The findings of at least some cognitive scientific subdisciplines may be simply orthogonal to each other rather than mutually constraining.

Even without embracing wholesale pessimism about cognitive scientific integration, we might worry that the relationships of constraint between the phenomenologist’s hypotheses about the essential structure of an experience and the causal understanding sought by mechanistic cognitive science will be particularly tricky to pin down. Take the relationship between Husserl’s characterisation of the anticipatory structure of visual phenomenology and contemporary ‘predictive processing’ models, briefly discussed in Chapter 4. The consonance between Husserl’s analysis and contemporary depictions of the sensing brain as a prediction machine is certainly striking. But there is no straightforward entailment between predictive phenomenology and predictive processing, in either direction. Experiences of anticipation needn’t be underpinned by machinery that anticipates; anticipating machinery need not support anticipatory experience. Of course, Pokropski’s framework does not require that the phenomenological construal entails some class of models of an explanatory target—just that it constrains the space of viable models in some substantive way. But how exactly does the Husserlian analysis in question do that? It does not mandate predictive processing models of experience—does it make them more probable? More intelligibility-conferring? More aesthetically-pleasing? Pokropski’s book does not provide a detailed account of the precise constraints that phenomenological analyses place on mechanistic explanations, either for this specific example or tout court. Clarifying the commitments of Pokropski’s framework on this score is another important avenue for future work.

Nonetheless, one of the ways in which Pokropski pushes the discussion on these topics forward is by putting such questions on the agenda of would-be naturalizers of phenomenology. Another is by highlighting the fertile terrain of contemporary mechanistic philosophy of science as a promising place to look for answers. As Pokropski rightly notes, work on naturalizing phenomenology is often couched in terms of 20th Century conceptions of scientific explanation and integration, ignoring the growing popularity of mechanistic accounts in recent years. Pokropski’s book should change that for the better. Anyone seeking to integrate phenomenology with cognitive science will benefit from reading it.


Husserl, E. 2014. Ideas for a Pure Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy: First Book: General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. Hackett.

Husserl, E. 1977. Phenomenological Psychology. Martinus Nijhoff.

Madary, M. 2017. Visual Phenomenology. MIT Press.