Media Argumentation: Dialectic, Persuasion, and Rhetoric

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Douglas Walton, Media Argumentation: Dialectic, Persuasion, and Rhetoric, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 386pp., $28.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521700306.

Reviewed by Gary Curtis, The Fallacy Files (


"Mass Media Argumentation" would be a more accurate title for this recent book by Douglas Walton, a prolific writer on argumentation, fallacies, informal logic, and related matters. Anyone looking for a discussion of new media forms, such as weblogs, internet videos, or podcasts, will be disappointed. However, despite the trendiness of such web-based media, the traditional forms of media are still predominant, with most of the newer types of media commenting on the products of the old-fashioned kind. So, mass media are still the most important sources of arguments for argumentation theorists to study, and are likely to be so for many years to come. However, there is another, theoretical reason to regret Walton's neglect of the new media, which I will address later in this review. So, by "media argumentation", Walton means the familiar types of argument found in publications, movies, and broadcast media, which are aimed at a mass audience that has limited opportunities to respond.

After two introductory chapters that explain and defend Walton's theoretical approach, the book is divided into chapters that deal with various aspects of mass media arguments: propaganda (ch. 3), emotional appeals (ch. 4) -- especially those that are thought to sway mass audiences, namely, fear and pity -- ad hominem attacks (ch. 5), appeals to popular opinion (ch. 6) -- including a separate chapter on public opinion polling (ch. 7) -- and persuasive definitions (ch. 8). Walton has dealt with most of these topics in greater depth in previous articles and books, notably, Arguer's Position (1985; on ad hominem arguments), The Place of Emotion in Argument (1992), and Appeal to Popular Opinion (1999).

Walton's theoretical approach is dialectical, as opposed to the monological approach of standard logic, that is, he treats media arguments as embedded in dialogues (chs. 1 and 2). Dialectically, an argument is a move in a dialogue, and is evaluated based upon how well it contributes to making progress towards the goal of the dialogue. Some of the traditional informal fallacies -- notably, straw man arguments -- only make sense when understood within this context. A straw man argument, when examined in isolation, may be a perfectly sound argument for its conclusion. The logical problem with such an argument is not internal to the argument itself, but due to the failure of its conclusion to be relevant to the topic of debate. In other words, a straw man argument may refute a certain thesis, but that thesis is the wrong one for the debate, for it is not the thesis of the arguer's opponent.

Mass media, because they communicate to large audiences, usually have little means of response and are, thus, more the domain of standard logic or of rhetoric, with its emphasis on speechifying, than of dialectic. Walton is aware that it is rather paradoxical to treat mass media arguments as dialectical, and dubs it the "Respondent-To-Dialogue" (RTD) problem, which is the problem of identifying a respondent in a supposed dialogue of which a mass media argument is a part (§4.4). This "problem" is really just an argument against the dialectical approach to most mass media arguments. It is as much a mistake to shoehorn every argument into a dialogue as it is to ignore dialectic when dealing with those arguments that do occur in dialogue. Argumentation is a complex set of phenomena, and it is unlikely that a single, simple theoretical approach will be able to adequately deal with that complexity.

Given Walton's rather single-minded emphasis on dialectic, it is unfortunate that he almost entirely ignores those newer forms of media that are more dialectical than traditional media. Interactive forms of media, such as "blogs" with their comment threads, are a more fertile ground for such treatment than the mass media. There is no RTD problem for these forms of media, since the respondent is obvious in the context.

Of course, some mass media arguments do occur in dialogues, for instance, political debates, and interview shows on broadcast media. So, an eclectic, case-by-case application of different standards would seem to be the best theoretical approach to evaluating media argumentation.

Another of Walton's methodological commitments is to presumptive, as opposed to deductive or inductive, reasoning (§1.6). For instance, if you see a bird ("Tweety" is its name in the literature on this subject) you will expect that it can fly. However, it is difficult to represent such reasoning as a deductive inference. The universal generalization "all birds can fly" is false, whereas the existential generalization "some birds can fly" does not validate the conclusion that Tweety can do so. Of course, you might expect that instead of "all birds can fly", the conclusion should be deduced from "all birds other than penguins, etc., can fly". There is a practical difficulty in spelling out the "et cetera" here, and one is tempted to just say "all birds can fly except for those that cannot" but that is vacuous and useless. Moreover, even if one could overcome the problem of specifying all the ways in which birds can fail to fly -- they have broken wings, their feet are set in concrete, their feathers have been clipped, etc. -- such a generalization will be of no help in the case of Tweety if all that we know is that it is a bird. The more exceptions we add to the rule, the more that we have to know about Tweety to be able to use it: we have to know that it isn't a penguin, doesn't have a broken wing, etc.

So, what is needed is a different type of generalization: a rule of thumb that will not be falsified by false instances, and such that any conclusions drawn from it are defeasible -- that is, they will be withdrawn when confronted with contrary evidence. Walton makes use of such rules of thumb in the form of argument "schemes", which are similar to the default rules used in artificial intelligence, but different from the argument forms of deductive logic. In a deductive argument form, if its premises are true then the conclusion must also be true -- that is what makes it valid. Put another way, it is logically impossible for the premises of a deductive argument form to be true and its conclusion false. In contrast, it is possible for the premises of an argument scheme to be true and its conclusion false, and this does not undermine it, for the argument in question is treated as an exception.

Presumptive reasoning is an important area for research in artificial intelligence into understanding common sense reasoning, but there is a lack of well-established standards by which to judge it. A.I. is an engineering research program, and the justification for using default rules is pragmatic. Rules of thumb are useful because they simplify the process of adding knowledge to the program, since the programmer does not have to spell out every exception to a rule. Also, they allow programs to make the kind of common sense inferences that people do. However, there does not seem to be an analogous pragmatic justification for using them to analyze mass media arguments. If anything, the situation is the reverse.

An instance of an argument scheme is supposed to shift the burden of proof to the respondent. Every argument scheme comes with a set of critical questions that the respondent can ask about an instance in order to shift the burden of proof back to the arguer. If the arguer can successfully answer all such critical questions, then the burden is shifted back again, and the argument is successful; but if the arguer fails to successfully answer some critical question, then the argument fails. There is much that is obscure in this account -- for instance, what determines success or failure in answering a critical question -- but the biggest problem is the RTD problem. Since in most mass media arguments there is no respondent to ask critical questions, every presumptive argument should be successful.

Outside of some possible A.I. application, the pragmatic value of argument schemes for argumentation theory seems to be negative, for they make it harder to evaluate arguments. As a result, Walton's evaluations of arguments are sometimes weaker and less definitive than they could be.

Lest this review seem too negative, it should be noted that these problems with Walton's theoretical approach mainly concern the first two chapters, together with the final one. The intervening six chapters, which are the heart of the book, are examinations of specific types of mass media arguments. There is a great deal of value in these middle chapters that is not adversely affected by these theoretical problems. Moreover, dialectic and presumptive reasoning are both useful tools for analyzing some mass media arguments.

I will not discuss all six chapters but only the two that I found most interesting and from which I learned the most, the first of which is the chapter on propaganda. Before reading this chapter, I thought that the word "propaganda" was a lost cause, as it is almost exclusively used as a verbal stick to beat on the other political party, whichever it may be. Walton is aware of its negative connotations (§3.1), but nonetheless sets out to give ten defining characteristics of propaganda.

The first characteristic is a dialectical structure, which I have said enough about, except that this is a particularly bad example of it, as propaganda is a paradigmatic example of mass persuasion. Leaving out the reference to dialectic (and to propaganda's ethical justification), here is Walton's definition in a nutshell: Propaganda is aggressive, one-sided, group advocacy using emotive language, and aimed at persuading a mass audience to act to support, or at least not to oppose, the interests or goals of the group (§3.6). Anyone wishing to study propaganda -- as opposed to simply using the term to attack the advocacy of views of which one disapproves -- should at least start with this definition, but it will still be necessary to warn people that the word has a misleadingly negative connotation.

The most interesting chapter for me is that devoted to problems with public opinion polls and other surveys, and their use in mass media, including use in propaganda. It does not deal with the familiar statistical problems of surveys, which are sufficiently dealt with elsewhere, but concentrates on logical problems of survey questions and their wording.

Walton discusses nine fallacies, if I count them correctly. Four of the fallacies concern the definition of key terms used either in questions or in the reporting of survey results (§7.1). Depending on how a key term is defined, the results of a survey can either be inflated or deflated. Usually, there are interest groups on both sides of a political issue, and one side will be motivated to exaggerate some problem in order to encourage greater government spending, while the other side will wish to downplay the problem in order to discourage tax increases. For instance, the number of people in poverty is always a controversial figure, and an interest group may conduct a survey designed to determine the figure (p. 233). Simply asking people whether they are "poor" may well result in a serious underestimate, as some people are unwilling to admit that they are poor. So, the survey may ask other questions designed to indirectly elicit information about poverty. The results will depend upon how the vague term "poverty" is defined, as a broad definition will produce a larger class of poor people than a narrow one. So, the first two fallacies are the result of the use of either broad or narrow definitions to inflate or deflate survey results.

Two similar fallacies are based on the use of persuasive definitions. In one, emotive language is used inappropriately in a definition in a way that affects how questions are answered; in the other, its use is concealed. According to Walton, the fallaciousness of all of these definitional fallacies is not in the survey itself, but in the way it is promoted by its sponsor or reported by the news media (p. 231). Reporters often fail to report the definitions used, thus making it difficult for the reader to evaluate survey results.

A fifth fallacy occurs when an atypical example is used as an ostensive definition of a key term (p. 238). For instance, the definition of the term "child abuse" may include neglect, but a report on the results of a survey may give as an example a dramatic case of murder. Given that murders are a small subset of child abuse cases, the example is likely to mislead readers about the seriousness of the problem.

The next three fallacies concern the wording of survey questions (§7.3). Empirical research has shown that the answers that people give to surveys can be very sensitive to the wording of the questions, so that logically-equivalent questions may be answered in significantly different ways. For this reason, Walton recognizes a generic fallacy of question structure bias. Specifically, people are easily confused by negation, and a question with two negations may be answered differently than a logically-equivalent question without the negations. So, there is a fallacy of double negation in question wording. The last of these question structure fallacies is a version of the general informal fallacy of false dichotomy, that is, a question commits the fallacy by inappropriately narrowing the range of options for an answer. This is a common problem in public opinion polls, which often use yes-no or multiple-choice questions. Of course, limiting the answers in this way makes it easier to quantify survey results, but it also can distort them. For instance, if a political poll limits choices to the two major parties, then the amount of third party support may be understated.

The final survey fallacy is a specific version of the generic fallacy of meaningless statistics, which is the result of reporting precise numbers about vague concepts. As Walton points out (p. 229), surveys can give a misleading appearance of objectivity and precision, especially when a poll is called "scientific" and has a precise, numerical margin of error. A "scientific" poll is simply one based on random sampling, and the margin of error quantifies only error due to sampling, rather than the kind of errors due to question wording that are codified in the nine fallacies.

It is unfortunate that this chapter is buried in a lengthy scholarly book, as it deserves a wider readership among those involved in polling, especially those who write poll questions, as well as journalists who report poll results and those of us who criticize their reporting. Of course, anyone interested in argumentation theory, and especially its application to mass media, will want to read Media Argumentation.