Media of Reason: A Theory of Rationality

Placeholder book cover

Matthias Vogel, Media of Reason: A Theory of Rationality, Darrell Arnold (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2012, 376pp., $55 (hbk), ISBN 9780231150583.

Reviewed by Jeffrey Flynn, Fordham University


This is an ambitious book. One of its central claims is that artistic action and aesthetic experience are essential dimensions of rationality and must be incorporated into a comprehensive theory of rationality. Taking art as an exemplary mode of nonlinguistic communication, the guiding idea is that language is only one medium of reason among others and that ultimately we need to "gain a view of the entire range of media through which the activity of mind can be expressed" (76). Its broadest aim is to develop a comprehensive theory of rationality by using the concept of media -- broadly defined as means for individuating thoughts -- to account for both linguistic and non-linguistic forms of understanding.

Vogel takes much of his theoretical inspiration from work by Habermas, Davidson, and Dewey. In his approach to rationality, Vogel follows Habermas and Davidson in arguing that a theory of rationality should be based on analyzing competencies that are central to our capacity for understanding, but aims to go beyond their focus mainly on linguistic understanding. In his analysis of artistic activity and aesthetic experience, Vogel takes his main cue from Dewey, who actually used the concept of media in his account of the communicative aspects of aesthetic experience.

The book appeared in German in 2001, and the English translation is a nice addition to Amy Allen's growing series at Columbia University Press, New Directions in Critical Theory. Unlike most of the books in the series, Vogel focuses less on social and political theory and more on the kind of foundational questions about rationality and language that Habermas has made central to the Frankfurt School tradition of critical theory. In fact, the ambitious scope of the book is not unlike work by Habermas, since Vogel engages analytic philosophy of mind and language, postmodern critiques of reason, social theory, media theory, aesthetics, and empirical research on cognitive development.

Chapter 1 begins by situating the aims of the book in relation to debates over the legacy of the Enlightenment project, focusing mainly on postmodern critics like Lyotard and defenders like Habermas, with some discussion of Rorty. Vogel maintains that a comprehensive theory of rationality that includes nonlinguistic modes of understanding would be less vulnerable to radical critiques of reason. He defines the "process of enlightenment" minimally as "the social process in which we develop and learn to understand our ability to understand" (15), insisting that this must include all possible modes of understanding. Vogel then surveys various theories of rationality, providing an excellent introduction to debates in Germany over the last few decades since it covers philosophers less familiar to many English readers, such as Herbert Schnädelbach, Friedrich Kambartel, Jürgen Mittelstraß, and Stefan Gosepath, alongside excellent critical summaries of Habermas and Davidson.

Chapter 2, "What are Media?," introduces the wide array of theories that invoke the concept of media from media studies to sociology and aesthetics. Vogel aims to show the disarray we are left in if the goal is to develop a robust and systematic general theory of media. Media studies, in focusing on technical means of communication like print, photography, radio, and film, is closest to our everyday use of the term. But Vogel argues that Marshall McLuhan's seminal work and subsequent work in media theory lacks the necessary theoretical depth or tools for analyzing media beyond the narrow everyday sense. Sociologists, in particular systems theorists like Talcott Parsons and Niklas Luhmann, along with Habermas insofar as he draws on systems theory, have used the term to account for how specialized social subsystems like the economic or political systems function and coordinate action through the use of media like money or power. Vogel maintains that they all rely on the concept of media to solve antecedent problems that arise from theory construction, resulting in heterogeneous uses of the concept. Dewey's work on aesthetics, on the other hand, turns out to be a fruitful starting point for developing a robust concept of media.

Chapters 1 and 2 together display the inadequacies of existing theories of rationality and theories of media, respectively, while establishing the need for a general theory of media as a contribution to a comprehensive theory of rationality. They also show the ways in which Davidson and Dewey provide good starting points for thinking about rationality and aesthetic experience, respectively.

Although Habermas's work on communicative rationality and broader concerns about normativity are clearly important for Vogel, his methodology is heavily indebted to Davidson. Davidson's focus on the situation of radical interpretation begins not as Habermas does with speakers who share a language, but with the question of how understanding is possible when speaker and hearer do not share a language. This allows one to get at issues of understanding on much slimmer premises than Habermas, which becomes important later when Vogel aims to analyze understanding as part of non-linguistic communication. He agrees with Davidson that some medium is necessary for individuating thoughts, but disagrees that language is the only one. Since he shares with Davidson "the belief that thinking is an ability that is acquired by internalizing social processes of interpretation" (67), he aims to expand Davidson's "interpretationism" by going beyond linguistic communication.

This is where Dewey comes in. Central to his account of aesthetic experience is the idea of art as a communicative activity. Though Vogel finds the approach underdeveloped, Dewey's idea that the communicative aspects of aesthetic experience are dependent on certain "mediating elements" (98) provides the model for developing a more general specification of media as "'instruments' for individuating higher-level intentional states" (141). The goal of the rest of the book is to develop and defend such a general theory of media.

Chapter 3, by far the longest chapter in the book, develops the main theory. It would be impossible to do justice to the sheer complexity of Vogel's analysis, but I will sketch some general outlines.

Inspired by Davidson's methodological focus on the situation of radical interpretation, Vogel proposes to decouple understanding from language in a three-step process that progressively reduces the linguistic preconditions for interpretation so that each element that a general theory of media must account for can be carefully identified (117-118). The scenarios and discussion at the heart of each step are all quite engaging.

Step one takes art as a paradigm of nonlinguistic media, focusing on interpreters endowed with language who are confronted with nonlinguistic (musical) expressions produced by someone who also has a language. Nonlinguistic art challenges a theory of understanding to account for two basic intuitions: works of art are untranslatable, but they are understandable. The scenario of two people who have listened to a concert together is used to identify the conditions under which one could say the other has understood the music. Here Vogel begins to develop the extensive technical apparatus of his media theory (compositional identity, elementary types of activity that constitute a medium, media elements, medial constellations, etc.), which is then tested in progressively more radical situations. This stage in the argument also includes analysis of the nature of music lessons in order to illuminate the process of learning through examples.

Step two assumes the more radical situation of interpretation in which it is not clear whether those to be interpreted actually speak a language. The fictional scenario is one in which an ethnolinguist and an ethnomusicologist end up debating whether an observed group is speaking a language in which certain syllables are uttered at various pitches or is actually engaged in singing.

Step three imagines beings without a language, but whom we nevertheless view as communicating with each other. The aim here is to develop a myth about the origins of media by telling a story about how interpretive competencies might develop within a group of nonhuman primates. It is essentially a story about the social origins of mind, but the burden for a media theory is to explain not the rise of language, but the rise of nonlinguistic media. In contrast to the central role of sanctions in Brandom's work, Vogel focuses on play.

What makes Chapter 3 interesting, but also quite demanding on the reader, is the multiple levels at which it operates as it moves from addressing central questions in aesthetics to complex issues in the philosophy of mind and language.

The central move Vogel makes in establishing the relation between media and the development of mind is to distinguish three levels of intentionality. Engaging Searle and Davidson in a set of set of preliminary moves, Vogel identifies this problem: nonlinguistic artistic action involves a form of higher-level intentionality that cannot be captured by either Searle's elementary form of pre-linguistic intentionality or Davidson's approach to higher-level intentionality as constituted by language. The solution is to identify a form of higher-level intentionality that requires a medium for its articulation, though not language, and then to explain the transition from elementary to higher-level intentionality.

Specifically, Vogel introduces a type of intentional state ("B-intentional states") that depends on the use of media, but is between sub-propositional desires ("A-intentional states") that do not require language and propositional attitudes ("C-intentional states") that do. B-intentional states are the key to analyzing the workings of non-linguistic thought (e.g., "musical thoughts") and the phylogenetic and ontogenetic development of mind and language. As Vogel puts it late in the book, "With B-intentional states we have not yet entered the realm of reasons, yet we have left the realm of nature insofar as we are concerned with socially conferred content" (274).

In expanding the theory of mind with a theory of media, Vogel introduces a 4-phase model (183-203) of the transition from basic to higher intentionality that is meant to at least be compatible with empirical research on cognitive development in children. The basic idea is to explain transitions from genetically based expressive behavior (phase 1) to pointing behavior (phase 2) to medial expressions (phase 3) to linguistic behavior (phase 4). Vogel departs from Davidson's triangulation model to explain higher-level intentionality, beginning in the first phase with affect-centered communication generated by caregiver's mimetic responses to children's emotionally expressive behavior. Without going into detail, the scope of Vogel's media theory can be grasped just by mentioning how he deploys it in phase 2 to describe pointing behavior in children as a "protomedial form of behavior" that uses "medial configurations . . . composed of a type of arm/hand movement and directions" (189), and in phase 3 to describe complex gestures as "medial expressions."

Chapter 4 includes a short excursus on Kant's theory of aesthetic experience as a theory of non-conceptual understanding (283-292), but the primary aim of this final chapter is to draw out the explanatory and normative benefits of Vogel's theory.

Regarding the explanatory benefits, one of the argumentative burdens Vogel takes up here is to show that nonlinguistic media are "constitutive conditions of reason" (273). I wasn't wholly convinced on every point, but there is much here that seems quite promising. In particular, he maintains that his theory can

gain a clearer view of the role of language . . . an advantage of this perspective is that it allows language to be described in a theoretically homogeneous vocabulary as a specific medium -- a medium, namely, that is subordinate to normative restrictions that allow it to become a medium for giving and asking for reasons. (275)

In reading the book, it took a while to get used to the idea of using the concept of "media" as a master concept for a theory of mind and rationality. But there is a powerful unifying idea at work here. A core notion is that artwork is the "means of a form of communication that is deeply rooted in fundamental processes of interaction through which we become beings with minds" (xiii). If media, and not just language, make communication and the individuation of thoughts possible, then a general theory of media has the potential to unify linguistic, prelinguistic, and nonlinguistic modes of communication in a single theory.

The section on the "normative returns" from the theory is all too brief (298-305) and left me with more questions than answers about the nature and source of the normativity at stake. For instance, Vogel introduces a "principle of medial understanding," which is intended as a very general principle to guide interpreters of nonlinguistic expressions and as a "nonlinguistic analogue to Davidson's principle of charity" (298-299). But there are significant disanalogies. First, Vogel's principle is to serve as a "standard for a good interpretation" (298), but Davidson's principle of charity is more like a fundamental assumption that an interpreter must make in order to see another as a speaker at all. Second, Vogel's principle focuses on an interpreter of a single "sensory-perceptible artifact" in the context of what he calls "radical medial interpretation" (299), whereas Davidson's principle is deployed in observing and interpreting patterns of behavior and utterances. It is easier to see how Davidson's principle of charity gains a purchase in that context than to see precisely what work Vogel's principle is supposed to do. I wish the final section gave us more to go on here.

Two other points about loose ends: First, Chapter 1 begins with big debates over the legacy of the Enlightenment, but Vogel returns to these themes only in a cursory way at the very end. Since a theory of media is supposed to make a theory of rationality less susceptible to a radical critique of reason, it would be helpful if Vogel had directly defended his theory against specific charges. Does the theory really lay to rest all the concerns raised by postmodern critics like Lyotard? Vogel doesn't say how. Nor is it entirely clear that attempting to bring the domain of aesthetic experience wholly within an expanded domain of rationality is the kind of move that would satisfy critics ranging from Adorno to Derrida.

Second, when Vogel returns to media studies proper at the end of Chapter 3, he doesn't provide much reason for them to take interest in his new theory. Surely he is right to point out that some of what gets referred to as media by such theorists would still count as media under his definition while some would not, "because they do not have anything to do with individuating thoughts" (263). But why should media theorists care about the conditions for individuating thoughts? That sounds more like a conceptual artifact arising from an investigation into the philosophy of mind and language than something that would concern media studies more generally. Without an argument here for the relevance of Vogel's vast array of definitions and principles, it may seem to media theorists like an idle exercise in classification. Hence, the book may be of less interest to media theorists in the narrow sense, though I don't know enough about the current state of that field to say for sure.

Those interested in aesthetics will find much of interest in the book, though they must be prepared to wade through a lot of dense material on other issues. The book's relevance to anyone with special interest in extending Davidson's project to include nonlinguistic communication should by now be obvious. But I think the potential contained in Vogel's theory is most evident when considered against the backdrop not of media studies or Davidson's theory of interpretation, but of even more systematic approaches like Habermas's theory of communicative action. Vogel boldly aims to unify, under a single concept of media, not only language and institutionalized media like money, but also prelinguistic and nonlinguistic forms of communication ranging from gesture to art. Beyond that, certainly anyone interested in fundamental questions about the nature of mind, language, and rationality will find much of interest in this book.