Medically Assisted Death

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Robert Young, Medically Assisted Death, Cambridge University Press, 2007, 251pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521706162.

Reviewed by John Keown, Georgetown University


The debate about whether voluntary active euthanasia (VAE) and/or physician-assisted suicide (PAS) should be legalized is one of the most important debates in contemporary bioethics. Since the Dutch Supreme Court declared VAE/PAS legal in 1984 and a voter referendum in Oregon permitted PAS ten years later, the debate has only grown in intensity. It is a debate which has generated a voluminous academic literature, so voluminous that it is increasingly difficult for an academic to say much that is original. The challenge is particularly acute for anyone writing yet another book in favor of decriminalization. Robert Young has taken on the challenge in Medically Assisted Death. Not all will agree that he has been successful.

Young argues that once it is agreed that dying patients, or those who find themselves in an "intolerably burdensome situation" (p. 219), may end their lives by requesting the withdrawal of medical treatment there is no logical obstacle to performing VAE/PAS when their lives are not being prolonged by medical treatment. He argues that VAE/PAS is required by respect for the autonomy of competent patients, for their right to determine the time and manner of their death. This right extends to incompetent patients who, while still competent, had made an advance directive requesting that their lives be ended or had appointed a proxy to make such a request for them.

Much of the book is an attempt to controvert leading arguments against legalization. Young rejects the principle of the sanctity of life, contending that it is only "qualitatively valuable human life" (p. 220) which merits protection and that the widespread practice of allowing patients to die when their lives could be prolonged is irreconcilable with the sanctity of life. He argues that there is nothing in the goals of medicine inconsistent with VAE/PAS and that the experience of jurisdictions which have permitted them "give cause for confidence" that legalization "will not result in jeopardy to the life prospects of vulnerable incompetent persons" (p. 221). Moreover, the current medical practice of allowing patients to die by withdrawing treatment judged to be futile is "a form of non-voluntary euthanasia" (p. 221). Young endorses non-voluntary active euthanasia but urges supporters of VAE/PAS not to do so "to ensure that they do not give ammunition to their opponents" (p. 221). He therefore recommends that whenever non-voluntary euthanasia is ethical it should be carried out "by way of strategies that opponents of voluntary medically assisted death cannot consistently oppose" such as the withdrawal of treatment (p. 221).

Many of these arguments will be familiar to anyone acquainted with the existing literature. Not only have most of the arguments in the book been rehearsed elsewhere, they have been better rehearsed. The book's case for decriminalization, and its attempted refutation of the case against decriminalization, are far less cogent than the author seems to think. His case for decriminalization is all too brief and its implications are not fully explored. For example, we are told that VAE/PAS for dying patients is required by respect for autonomy but this is largely assumed rather than argued. What is the basis of the principle of respect for autonomy and what are its proper limits? Again, if respect for autonomy requires VAE/PAS for the dying, why not for those who are simply "tired of life" (as influential voices in the Netherlands are now urging)? Again, Young holds that only human lives which reach a certain threshold of "quality" merit protection. Why not, then, advocate active non-voluntary euthanasia to dispatch those who would be better off dead? His argument that to do so would give ammunition to those who claim that there is a "slippery slope" between voluntary and non-voluntary euthanasia is striking. If VAE is justified (at least partly) because the lives of certain competent patients are no longer worth living, and if non-voluntary active euthanasia is justified because the lives of certain incompetent patients are no longer worth living, is it not remarkable to call for decriminalization of only the former lest its opponents draw attention to the link between the two? In any event, as Yale Kamisar's seminal writing half a century ago illustrates, the link has long been identified by opponents of VAE.

Opponents of VAE have argued cogently that the moral justification for VAE is not simply respect for patient autonomy -- no responsible doctor would perform VAE just because the patient asked for it -- but the doctor's judgment that the patient would be better off dead, and that if the doctor can make this judgment in relation to a competent patient the doctor can make the same judgment in relation to an incompetent patient similarly situated. Why should the doctor deny the incompetent patient the "benefit" of death merely because the patient cannot request it? Young attempts to refute this argument by claiming that it rests on a "common error", namely,

the error of assuming that a patient's best interests can be judged entirely by reference to the patient's medical interests (since it is only in relation to these latter that the medical professional could possibly lay claim to having a better vantage point from which to determine a patient's interests than the patient). (p. 184)

However, the burden of the logical "slippery slope" argument is not that the doctor has a better vantage point or that the doctor limits his or her judgment to the patient's medical interests. It is that in agreeing to perform VAE the doctor makes the judgment that the patient would be better off dead, and that once the doctor is prepared to make such a judgment in relation to a competent patient, there is no logical reason why the doctor cannot make the same judgment in relation to an incompetent patient. Those, like Young, who advocate the legalization of only VAE/PAS, rest their case on two principles: respect for autonomy and the duty of beneficence (which entails a duty to end a life which is no longer worth living). But their argument for VAE is no argument against non-voluntary euthanasia. On the contrary: when, as in the case of an incompetent patient, there is no autonomy to respect, the duty of beneficence still operates. Yet again, Young's attempt to deny the "slippery slope" seems only to confirm it.

Further, his grasp of the principle of the sanctity of life is uncertain, resulting, for example, in an unconvincing dismissal of the significance it attaches to the distinction between intention and foresight. He therefore conflates cases which the principle keeps distinct, such as on the one hand administering a lethal injection to end a patient's life and on the other withdrawing treatment because it is futile or too burdensome while merely foreseeing the acceleration of death. Had he engaged more fully with the work of leading defenders of the principle, not least those writing in the "new" natural law tradition such as Finnis, Grisez and Gomez-Lobo, his book would have been much the better for it.

Young rests his case for decriminalization of VAE/PAS not only on philosophical argument but also on empirical evidence. Here again he finds himself on shaky ground. First, he devotes most of his attention to the experience of the Netherlands and has very little to say about Oregon. This is surprising. While it is true, as he points out, that there is much more data about the former, there is now a significant body of material, statistical and scholarly, on the latter, such as the superb treatise by Neil Gorsuch, The Future of Assisted Suicide and Euthanasia (2006) (a volume which Young does not mention). Secondly, even Young's own sympathetic analysis of the Dutch experience, which is open to the criticism of being somewhat superficial and selective, does little to assuage "slippery slope" concerns. For example, although the Dutch began in 1984 by permitting only VAE/PAS, he notes that their own official surveys have unearthed a widespread practice of non-voluntary euthanasia. Young tries to downplay its significance by arguing that this is "indistinguishable from what in other jurisdictions is accepted as normal medical practice" (pp. 190-191). This is misleading. Injecting lethal doses of drugs with the purpose of ending an incompetent patient's life, which is what the Dutch doctors admitted to doing, is not "accepted as normal medical practice" elsewhere. It is condemned by professional ethics and punishable as murder. No less significantly, there has been a palpable shift in Dutch thinking since 1984. Then the emphasis was on respect for patient autonomy and non-voluntary euthanasia was openly condemned as "murder". Times have changed. For example, in the 1990s, Dutch courts condoned the non-voluntary active euthanasia of disabled neonates. Young mentions these decisions but does not seem to recognize that they provide compelling evidence of the slide predicted by those opposed to VAE: from official support for VAE to official support for non-voluntary active euthanasia.

In relation to competent patients, Young advocates safeguards to ensure that the patient is competent, free from coercion, and psychiatrically healthy. He claims that "these are just the sorts of requirements" which have been legislated in the Netherlands and Oregon (p. 54). This looks like wishful thinking. In the Netherlands there is no requirement that patients undergo a psychiatric or psychological evaluation before accessing VAE/PAS. In Oregon patients are to be referred only if either of the two doctors involved (neither of whom need have expertise in psychiatry) thinks that a patient may be suffering from a psychiatric or psychological disorder or "depression causing impaired judgment". Only one in ten patients who have accessed PAS has in fact been so referred. Moreover, even if the patient is competent when the lethal prescription is obtained, there is nothing in the Oregon law to ensure that when the patient takes the lethal drugs, perhaps several months later, the patient is still competent, let alone "psychiatrically healthy".

An important statement opposing the decriminalization of PAS issued in 2006 by the Royal College of Psychiatrists (a statement not mentioned by Young) cautioned that there is a clear association between requests for PAS and clinical depression; that doctors lacking expertise in psychiatry often fail to spot depression, and that when patients' depression is treated, virtually all change their mind about wanting PAS. To claim that the weak safeguards in the Netherlands and Oregon ensure that patient autonomy is respected is to part company with reality.

Medically Assisted Death is, generally, engagingly and clearly written, and contains a number of interesting observations on a range of issues central to the euthanasia debate. However, not all will agree that its criticisms of the principle of the sanctity of life do the principle justice; that its case for VAE/PAS rests on secure foundations; that it succeeds in refuting the "slippery slope" argument, or that its reading of the Dutch experience is reliable. Last but not least, the book is handicapped by the fact that much of the ground it covers, both in terms of philosophical analysis and empirical evidence, is already very well traversed.