Medicine and Philosophy in Classical Antiquity: Doctors and Philosophers on Nature, Soul, Health and Disease

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Philip J. van der Eijk, Medicine and Philosophy in Classical Antiquity: Doctors and Philosophers on Nature, Soul, Health and Disease, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 418pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521818001.

Reviewed by Katerina Ierodiakonou, National Technical University, Athens


This volume contains eleven papers by Philip van der Eijk, Professor of Greek at the University of Newcastle upon Tyne, papers which mostly were published in the 1990's in various journals and collections of articles. Seven of these papers originally were published in their present form, one is a slightly expanded version of the original paper (ch. 3), another two are the English translations of papers published in Dutch and German (chs. 4, 5), and one paper is new, though based on material from earlier books and articles by the author (ch. 6). The purpose of this volume, as van der Eijk himself says, is to make these papers more easily accessible, especially since their general theme, the interrelations between ancient philosophy and medicine, recently has been gaining a growing public. But even experts will welcome that these papers are now available in one volume.

The volume is divided into three parts under the following headings: I. Hippocratic Corpus and Diocles of Carystus. II. Aristotle and his School. III. Late Antiquity. It also includes at the end a comprehensive bibliography of fifty pages, and two useful indexes, an index of passages and a general index. Even a hasty look at the titles of the chapters shows that, although the Hippocratic corpus, Diocles of Carystus and Aristotle are at the centre of van der Eijk's interest, the themes which he deals with are remarkably varied: the role of the Divine in the Hippocratic treatise On the Sacred Disease (ch. 1), Diocles' views on causal explanation (ch. 2), the medical principles and their application to therapeutical practice (ch. 3), the ancient debate about the location of the mind (ch. 4), Aristotle's views on melancholy (ch. 5), Aristotle's methodology in his treatment of divination in sleep (ch. 6), Aristotle's account of the bodily aspects of thinking (ch. 7), the divine movement in Eudemian Ethics 8.2 (ch. 8), and Aristotle's medical treatise On Sterility (ch. 9). The third part on late antiquity contains two further chapters, one on Galen's concept of 'qualified experience' (ch. 10), and one on Caelius Aurelianus' development of the basic doctrines of the Methodist school of medicine (ch. 11).

If one thus lists the eleven chapters of van der Eijk's volume, its unity is not immediately apparent. Also, one wonders why the last two papers on late antiquity are included in a volume whose title refers to classical antiquity. A closer reading of all the papers, however, makes clear that the motivation behind van der Eijk's analysis of these diverse topics spanning the whole of antiquity is the systematic inquiry into the theoretical and methodological interrelations between ancient medicine and philosophy; and this undoubtedly is a theme not at all foreign in particular to students of late antiquity, although van der Eijk himself has devoted most of his work to the interrelations between ancient medicine and philosophy in the classical period. For all of van der Eijk's papers seem meant to suggest that the disciplinary boundaries in antiquity are extremely flexible, and that even in the Hellenistic period and late antiquity, when there is a great deal of specialisation and fixing of boundaries, there still are important thinkers, such as Galen, who constantly cross the boundaries between medicine and philosophy. Van der Eijk's choice of the specific topics he deals with is such that each paper unravels yet another aspect of the interrelation between ancient medicine and philosophy. That is to say, he chooses to comment on medical writings which raise questions of a philosophical character, but also on philosophical texts which talk about issues based on physiological facts. For instance, van der Eijk analyses the different views expressed by ancient doctors on human nature, on causation, on the extent to which the Divine is supposed to influence the emergence and treatment of a disease, on the connections between medical practice and the theoretical study of nature or at least human nature; he also undertakes to look into the ancient philosophers' claims about the bodily aspects of sense-perception and thinking, about conditions which lie between health and disease such as that of the melancholic, or about psycho-physiological topics such as sleeping and dreaming. This is why the subtitle of this volume refers to nature, soul, health and disease, thus picking out some of the main themes which both doctors and philosophers were concerned with during the whole of antiquity. Moreover, van der Eijk manages here to identify some of the methodological questions that both ancient philosophers and doctors raised. For instance, the relation between theoretical presuppositions and empirical observations, the understanding and use of concepts such as those of a sign, a cause, an indication, a proof, but also of definition, division, and analogy.

Some of the individual papers already have been assessed and criticized by experts in the particular fields, as van der Eijk himself informs us, for instance in the postscripts which follow chapters 1, 2, 8, and 9. What really is novel in this volume is its very substantial introduction. In it van der Eijk explains the approach which underlies his own work in general and which gives unity to the papers assembled in this collection. A crucial part of the underlying view is that one cannot adequately study ancient philosophy without often having to take note of developments in ancient medicine, and the other way round. Hence in what follows I will focus on this introduction.

Right at the beginning of the introduction van der Eijk suggests that the innovative character of his work primarily lies in his approach to the medical writings of antiquity, an approach which is in line with an important shift we can observe in the way ancient medicine has come to be studied during the last two decades. For, as van der Eijk points out, what used to characterise the earlier study of ancient medicine, and in general the study of ancient thought, was some kind of teleological progressivism that paid particular attention to those aspects in which classical medicine was regarded as having managed to solve problems which modern medicine considers as central, or at least to suggest the beginnings of solutions to these problems. That is to say, it used to be the case that those who studied ancient medicine had the tendency to isolate from their ancient context those elements which they regarded interesting from their modern perspective, and to seek in the ancient texts possible answers to questions which arose out of the state of medicine or the culture of their times. It is as if they needed to appropriate the works of ancient medical doctors, in order to be able to learn something from them. But this had the result of losing sight of what specifically characterises ancient thought; one only would get a highly partial and anachronistic view of the topics and methods of ancient doctors. By contrast, the new approach requires that the scholars who work on ancient medical texts try in a way to alienate them, in the sense that they try to view them in their own historical context, always searching to figure out the expectations, assumptions, norms, and values of the time. This new approach, as van der Eijk says, primarily seeks to understand medical ideas and practices as products of the culture during a particular period in time and place. Studying the ancient texts in their context helps us to make better sense of the theories found in them, theories which otherwise often sound naïve. We also avoid oversimplifications and become more sensitive to the subtle differences between ancient views. Of course, such an approach requires a very close reading of the texts, a particular attention to the terms used and their ancient meanings, a systematic study of the different genres to which these texts belong, of the different audiences for which they were produced, of the different kinds of rhetoric used each time, of the different means used for the transmission of knowledge. And this involves developing the study of ancient medicine as an interdisciplinary field, engaging scholars from very different disciplines which can shed light on ancient medical texts, including philologists, ancient historians, philosophers, historians of science, archaeologists, and medical anthropologists.

This, briefly, is the new approach to ancient medicine which van der Eijk advocates. And his inquiry into the interrelations between ancient medicine and philosophy comes to cover at least some of the gaps which were left by the earlier approach. But does he actually follow this new approach in the eleven papers which are included in his volume? I think that much of van der Eijk's work is just good, very solid, traditional scholarship; at the same time, though, he is nothing but faithful to the principles of the new approach throughout this volume, and it is in good part from this that the novelty of his work results. To give some examples: Scholars used to stress the rational character of Greek medicine as the forerunner of modern scientific medicine and its achievements. However, as van der Eijk shows in chapter 1, a close reading of the Hippocratic corpus, a reading free from modern views and attitudes, makes clear that in antiquity there were no clear boundaries, and certainly no hostility and antagonism, between the secular medicine and the medicine which invoked the Divine as the cause of diseases and as the reason for their specific treatment. Also, van der Eijk's approach manages to avoid anachronistic distortions from which previous accounts of ancient medicine suffered. For instance, as van der Eijk shows in chapter 2, we should avoid projecting later developments in ancient medicine onto an earlier period; thus we should not associate Diocles's views with the Empiricists of the Hellenistic period. Similarly, we need to be particularly careful when such distortions and schematisations are presented by the ancient writers themselves. For instance, as he shows in chapter 4, we should not uncritically trust the doxographers who present doctors and philosophers as expressing views on the topic of the location of the mind which many of them never phrased in these terms. Finally, on the methodological level, van der Eijk stresses in chapter 6 that it is highly problematic to use our modern notion of experiments when we talk about the data which Aristotle collects in order to support his theories. For it is not at all clear whether they constitute deliberate observations by Aristotle and his pupils with the purpose of testing a theoretical assumption, or whether they simply constitute detailed lists of often common human experiences. Thus, we need to wait until the introduction of Galen's concept of a qualified use of experience, about which van der Eijk talks in chapter 10, in order to come closer to our modern concept of a deliberate examination of a specific phenomenon in a determined and controlled set of circumstances.

But should we endorse this new approach? There is one point on which I find myself in disagreement with van der Eijk. I agree that his approach is beneficial to our understanding of ancient thought; however, I do also think that some degree of appropriation is required and certainly cannot be avoided. For the questions that we initially ask of the surviving evidence from antiquity cannot but be questions which we ourselves find interesting; and it is precisely because of these that we feel the urge to study antiquity. That is to say, we cannot deny that we do possess a certain perspective and it would be dangerous to think that our grasp of antiquity is not at all coloured by our point of view. In fact, it is as if the way scholarship has developed, from appropriation to alienation, also has to be the way that we approach our ancient heritage; we first, because of our interests and views, need to relate to it so that it arouses our curiosity, and then to put it into its context in order to have a more faithful picture of it.

To conclude, van der Eijk's introduction does not only provide us with a helpful presentation of the current state of affairs in the study of ancient medicine; it also tries to sketch the various directions which future research should concentrate on. And there are occasions in the chapters of his volume in which he gives specific advice. For example in chapter 7, he admits the limitations of his account and encourages students of Aristotle's to take seriously passages in which the material aspect in thinking is discussed. Or again in chapter 11, he explicitly says that there is much more work to be done on the issue of how ancient thinkers appropriate their predecessors, for instance the way Caelius Aurelianus appropriates Soranus, or Galen appropriates Hippocrates. I believe that this is one of the most important benefits of following the new approach and of reading van der Eijk's volume. For it not only helps us to realise the richness of ancient medical texts, and in general of ancient thought, at the same time it provides us with the methodological tools to study them in such a way that the results are as rewarding as they can be.