Medieval Islamic Philosophical Writings

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Muhammad Ali Khalidi (ed. and trans.), Medieval Islamic Philosophical Writings, Cambridge University Press, 2005, 236pp, $25.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521529638.

Reviewed by David B. Burrell, C.S.C., University of Notre Dame


This selection of medieval Islamic texts graces the series edited by Karl Ameriks and Desmond Clarke, Cambridge texts in the History of Philosophy, notably by reminding us today just how "eccentric" (Remi Brague) is a Europe which ever borrowed from other cultural realms. Moreover, the selections are mainline, which will make the volume useful for introducing students into this arena, while the editor's fresh translations of each text provide a uniformity of interpretation and of style, and a rich list of sources for "further reading" offer windows for more inquiring readers. All of this more than answers my original query: why offer fresh translations of works already rendered into western languages? The list of selections, taken from al-Farabi's Book of Letters, Ibn Sina's [Avicenna] On the Soul, al-Ghazali's Rescuer from Error, Ibn Tufayl's philosophical parable: Hayy bin Yaqzan, and Ibn Rushd's [Averroes] Incoherence of the Incoherence, is exemplary.

Moreover, the choice is illustrative of the range of philosophical concerns in the Islamicate, from rigorous argumentation in al-Farabi, Ibn Sina, and Ibn Rushd, to the Augustinian-like reflections of al-Ghazali and allegorical explorations of Ibn Tufayl -- a genre that Ibn Sina explored later in life as well. What I find most judicious is the editor and translator's choice not to pit al-Ghazali against Ibn Rushd, in the usual fashion suggested by the polemical title of Ibn Rushd's response to Ghazali's Incoherence of the Philosophers. For that Ghazali was already himself engaged in polemics, whereas his own stock-taking after a deep "epistemological crisis" (MacIntyre) affords a richer entry into his philosophical skills as well as his person. The downside of this eccentric juxtaposition is that we only hear Ibn Rushd's version of Ghazali on central issues like causality, but it would have been impossible to expound Ghazali's exploratory inquiry in this issue from a single work, so better offer a tantalizing aporia which students can then try to unravel. Withal, however, the juxtapositions offered by this selection of texts amply display the vitality of Islamic philosophy in its most creative age, which effectively catalyzed the vitality of western medieval dialectical exchanges. Yet by focusing on this canonical group of thinkers, such a selection can unwittingly reinforce the canard that Islamic philosophy ended with Ghazali's critique of "the philosophers" -- a criticism that not even Averroes was able to overcome, with a narrative which eurocentrism has tended to perpetuate. Yet when the reconquista undermined the intercultural and inter-religious milieu of Andalusia, both Jews and Muslims returned to the eastern Mediterranean. Key figures in this fresh renaissance of Islamic philosophy -- like Maimonides (a Jew thoroughly at home in the Islamicate), Suhrawardi, Ibn al-Arabi, and Mulla Sadra -- deserve also to be introduced to this western-oriented history of philosophy series. Yet what we have been offered represents an auspicious beginning.