Medieval Trinitarian Thought from Aquinas to Ockham

Placeholder book cover

Russell L. Friedman, Medieval Trinitarian Thought from Aquinas to Ockham, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 198pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521117142.

Reviewed by Richard Cross, University of Notre Dame


Russell L. Friedman is the author of a 1997 Ph.D. dissertation from the University of Iowa, the subject of which is Trinitarian theology between 1250 and 1325. The dissertation has had wide circulation and is frequently quoted in the literature. But it has never been published. The book here under review is not the dissertation — though I see that Friedman expects to publish a version of it with Brill in the (presumably near) future. Rather, the book is a brilliant distillation of the dissertation, based on four lectures Friedman gave at the Ecole pratique des hautes ├ętudes in the Sorbonne in 2008 and reflecting ten years further sustained reflection on the topic. Friedman’s argument, in nuce, is this. From the middle of the thirteenth century, two very distinct and opposed ways of thinking about the Trinity emerged, loosely clustered respectively around the Dominican order and the Franciscan order. The starting point of both traditions was the attempt to locate the distinctions between the persons of the Trinity within the scheme of Aristotle’s Categories — an attempt that has a venerable history all the way back to Augustine and earlier. Given that all three divine persons share the same essence, the question is what kind of feature might be able to distinguish the persons from each other.

The Dominican approach focuses on the category of relation: the persons are distinct by their relations to each other (relations, respectively, of being a father, being a son, and being something “spirated”). Despite appearances, these relations are not supposed to be anything like causal relations, and the appropriate analytical tool is the Aristotelian category of relation, not that of action/passion. But there are causal relations, or something like them, in the Trinity, and the alternative, Franciscan, approach focuses on these, making the “causal” categories of action and passion central to the explanation for the distinction between the persons. The persons are distinct because of the causal relations — “emanation” relations, as it was often expressed — between them: one produces the other two, and these latter are produced in two different ways, by nature and by will, respectively.

Both sides agree that the divine persons include both the relevant non-causal relations and the relevant kinds of emanation. At stake is this: do the relations explain the distinction between the persons (and thus ground the emanations), or do the emanations explain the distinctions of the persons (and thus ground the relations)? The Franciscans believe the emanations to explain the relations; the Dominicans hold that the persons must be constituted by their relations antecedently (as it were) to the emanation relations between them. In favor of the Dominican view is the following consideration: in order to cause the Son, the Father must already (as it were) exist, and thus cannot be constituted precisely by the causal relation that he has to the Son. But the Franciscan view is better suited to explain the constitution of the Son (and, mutatis mutandis, the Holy Spirit): the existence of the Son presupposes the Father’s causal activity; his being generated is precisely what distinguishes him from the Father. And this suggests that the emanations ground the relations.

Chapter 1 deals with these divergent traditions in key thirteenth-century theologians: Bonaventure, Aquinas, Henry of Ghent and John Pecham. Chapter 2 moves the story on to the early fourteenth century and explains ways in which the rather abstract considerations discussed in the first chapter make a significant difference to the ways in which the doctrine is understood. Pivotal is Duns Scotus. Following Henry of Ghent’s acceptance of the basic Franciscan model outlined in chapter 1, Scotus associates the emanation “by nature” with an emanation by intellect, parallel to the emanation by will. Friedman suggests that the impetus for this move comes from Augustine’s analogy between the Son and a mental word or concept. Be that as it may, Scotus has a reason for it, which Friedman hints at in a later chapter: God the Father is fundamentally a mind, and the natural activity of a mind is to form concepts — cognitive acts. So the Father automatically generates a mental “word,” somehow identified as the divine Son — a concept of the divine essence. And any perfect mind with a concept of the divine essence automatically loves that essence: hence the spiration of the Holy Spirit, analogous to an appetitive act. Chapter 2 concludes with an extensive and very valuable account of Scotus’s cognitive psychology.

In addition to holding that the psychological model is to be construed more or less literally, Scotus holds that a distinction in the ways in which the Son and Spirit are produced requires a distinction between the sources of these two emanations: one and the same power cannot produce in two distinct ways. (To motivate this claim, consider what else than a difference in power could explain the distinction between the two kinds of emanation: certainly not a difference in substrate or patient, since there is no substrate or patient in this case.) And in chapter 3 Friedman discusses this: specifically, Scotus’s claim that there must be a “formal” distinction between the divine intellect and will; the divine intellect and will are non-identical but inseparable. Friedman goes on to discuss the reaction to this move, emphasizing the discontinuity between thirteenth- and fourteenth-century speculations. Scotus’s motivation is to produce what Friedman calls an “explanatorily dense” account of the Trinity and to do so even at the expense of radical divine simplicity (since he posits formal distinctions between different divine attributes/powers).

Many fourteenth-century theologians thought that divine simplicity should be prioritized over theology’s explanatory power and thus were uncomfortable with Scotus’s formal distinction in this context. This might seem to raise problems for the psychological model, since if Scotus is right that model ultimately relies on some kind of distinction between different divine powers. Friedman apparently thinks it does, for he presents the views of Peter Auriol and William Ockham — thinkers who accept the psychological model but deny the distinction between powers — as though they are problematic in just this way. This is not so clear to me: we might be reductionists about powers and parse all power language simply in terms of the kinds of items that a thing can produce, or the kinds of thing it can do, without making additional metaphysical commitments: and nothing about this kind of reductionism is evidently incoherent.

The final chapter traces further the fourteenth-century stress on divine simplicity. Not only is there a tendency to deny distinctions between different divine powers, there is also a tendency to deny that the distinction between the divine persons needs to be explained by anything over and above the divine essence. Friedman labels this view “Praepositinianism,” after Praepositinus of Cremona, the late twelfth-century thinker who first espoused the view. (Strictly speaking, the view is that nothing other than the person itself explains its distinction from the other persons, such that we should not appeal to some feature of the person to do this: but since each person is supposed to be the same as the divine essence, the position is basically the same as one that makes the essence the sole ground for personal distinction.) Given that the divine essence is wholly simple and undifferentiated, the question that arises is simply whether it itself could be sufficient to ground the differences in predication between the three persons. Scotus, again, can appeal to the formal distinction — a distinction between the divine essence and the property or properties proper to each person — but the fourteenth-century thinkers Friedman considers here (Walter Chatton, Robert Holcot and Gregory of Rimini) reject any such distinction. Friedman argues that this move amounts to fideism: restricting the power of reason to provide genuinely explanatory accounts of Christian doctrines, content rather with restating the doctrines than with explaining them.

Friedman narrates the story with verve and astonishing clarity. And he packs a huge amount into a book of little more than 50,000 words. The material is of sufficient philosophical interest to appeal to an expert; but the work is written in a style that makes it accessible to the neophyte too. Needless to say, there is much to agree with and much to disagree with. I have already indicated one point at which I dissent from Friedman’s account. Here I will focus on one further, but important, issue. As Friedman sets up the Trinitarian question, the problem is the following: “According to this doctrine, the Father, the Son, and the Holy Spirit are distinct and yet identical: distinct as persons, identical as God… . Identity and distinction: that is the major issue in Trinitarian theology” (p. 2). This raises (at least) two expectations: first, that the medieval theologians thought that the doctrine of the Trinity raises problems for identity: specifically, that identity in this context cannot be Leibnizian identity; secondly, that the solution to this problem in the Trinitarian context turns out to be some kind of relative identity (suggested by the adverbial modifiers “as persons,” “as God”). Neither of these claims is true. In fact, the expectations were false in any case: Friedman makes no mention of relative identity, and rightly so. But the problem is this: he never explains what the alternatives countenanced by the medievals actually amount to. He does not point out that they do indeed — at least by the time of Scotus — have a Leibniz-style notion of identity, and that they attempt to develop both metaphysical analyses of the Trinity and appropriate terminology that allow them to incorporate this notion into their Trinitarian speculations (and, indeed, to their accounts of the material world too).

The solution clearly outlined in Scotus is a notion of sameness that falls short of identity. There is a terminological problem that makes it not so clear that this is what is going on. The Latin word for ‘same’ is ‘idem’: hence ‘sameness’ is ‘identitas.’ Scotus’s solution involves identifying different kinds of identitas — different kinds of sameness, not different kinds of identity: specifically, sameness with and without identity. Now it may be that sameness just is identity: the matter is, of course, highly controversial in modern discussions. But it is important to understand that it is just this point — whether sameness is or is not identity — that forms the starting point for Trinitarian discussion in the Middle Ages. This seems to me to be so even in earlier thinkers, who lack the metaphysical and terminological resources of Scotus. And I think this volume would be even better than it is if it had set the issue up in this way and then explored it in the metaphysically orientated chapters. The really interesting debates, curiously enough, lie in the different ways in which the notions of sameness and identity inform discussions about the nature of material substances. Is the Trinity something truly exceptional, or can we make sense of it merely using commonplace philosophical distinctions required for an account of the metaphysical constitution of material substances? The answer to this question depends in part on the preferred doctrine of the Trinity and its relation to questions of divine simplicity; but it perhaps depends to a greater extent on a thinker’s account of the metaphysical constitution of material substances. And there was much more debate on this latter issue, I think, than on the doctrine of the Trinity.

Still, exploring these kinds of questions would make for a much larger book than this and would arguably involve extensive discussion of metaphysical issues far wider in range than would be appropriate in what is clearly supposed to be an introductory book. Overall, a magnificent achievement, highly recommended for anyone with an interest in the topic.