Melville among the Philosophers

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Corey McCall and Tom Nurmi (eds.), Melville among the Philosophers, Lexington, 2017, 232pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498536745.

Reviewed by Michael Jonik, University of Sussex


In their expansive new collection, Corey McCall and Tom Nurmi seek to orient Herman Melville's writing around the question, as prompted by Wordsworth's "Ode on Immortality," "What, exactly, is a philosophic mind in a world of constant change?" (vii). To answer, they draw together a group of contemporary practicing American philosophers committed to engaging issues raised by Melville's writing, both to examine Melville's own ontological probing, as well as to measure the philosophical stakes of his political thought for both his convulsive century as well as our own. The book is consequently divided between investigations of "Melville as Philosopher" and "Melville's Philosophical Inheritors," and places Melville in conversation with the history of philosophy in terms of Plato, Descartes, Emerson, Nietzsche or Husserl, and more recent work by Deleuze, Cavell, and Rancière. (The volume's engagement with other important philosophical forebears such as Spinoza, Scottish Common Sense philosophy, Goethe, Hegel, or Schopenhauer is less broadly realized). The book closes with an "Afterword" by Cornel West, who beseeches the current generation of American philosophers to break their silence on -- or silencing of -- Melville's thought.

Construed in this fashion, the book (perspicuously titled to explore Melville's work within several philosophical milieus) emerges at a propitious time for work reassessing Melville's philosophical writing, joining K.L. Evan's and Branka Arsić's Melville's Philosophies (Bloomsbury 2017) and recent philosophically informed literary critical works by Sharon Cameron, Geoffrey Sanborn, Paul Hurh, and Cody Marrs. By positing Melville among the Philosophers as "among" cognate recent studies, one might ask what it distinctively brings to bear on current conversations. The "linchpin," as it were, is precisely this notion of being "among." To be "among" here signifies, variously, the sets of relations that bear on Melville's generic disposition as a literary writer of philosophy; his relations with his philosophical interlocutors; the geographies and geopolitics at stake in his work; how he envisions communities realized through becomings and the compositing of differences; a dissection of the chronotope of slavery; processes of decolonization; and, perhaps counterintuitively, silence as a form of relation, if a relation to what is unknowable or ineffable.

Troy Jollimore's opening chapter explores "amongness" in terms of Melville's incipient pragmatist tendencies and his performance of religious pluralism in his notoriously epic and enigmatic poem Clarel (1976). Jollimore holds that the poem's philosophicality -- if not literature's philosophicality more generally -- is to be measured not in terms of the unfolding of an argumentative style, but as the performance of how ideas become embodied and lived. The ideas thus performed in Clarel are ideas of religious faith, skepticism and "the silence of God," in a modernity marked by the recession of the divine. Jollimore's guide to Clarel's pilgrimage is William James, to whom he makes frequent appeals to understand Melville's complex and often conflicting dramatizations of religious belief. This allows Jollimore to gauge profitably the religious investments of individual characters in the poem, such as Derwent, Nehemiah, Margoth, or Ruth, as varying embodiments of Melville's sense of religious pluralism in the second half of the nineteenth century. Yet, one gets the sense that Jollimore could have further probed the Melville-James connection by doing more close textual and conceptual analysis, rather than by rehearsing the oft-cited passages from Clarel regarding Darwin or stones, or, in a similar fashion, Hawthorne's depiction of Melville's own belief or non-belief. In some ways, the Pragmatist prerogative imputes a false measure on the poem: Jollimore considers the poem a failure (thus joining a long line of negative criticism of the poem) because it does not succeed at reconciling irreconcilables in any satisfying, radically empiricist way.

Mark Anderson's wide-ranging essay on Melville, Plato and Nietzsche takes as its point of departure Melville's own life, the premise being that Melville and Ishmael are roughly correlate and that we can read Moby-Dick as a kind of "spiritual autobiography." (And here we must wonder if philosophers writing on Melville will have heard of the intentional fallacy or the death of the author). The first part of essay offers a helpful and informed mini-catalogue of Plato references in Melville's work, and dwells interestingly on Melville's reworking of themes from the Phaedo. But too often Anderson does little more than point out Platonic themes or put them in "suggestive," "resonant" or "reminiscent" relation to Melville's ideas. One might wonder, since it is a recurrent theme in Mardi, Moby-Dick, and elsewhere, how materiality and ideality, or physical embodiment and metaphysical loss of self might be re-understood in light of Melville's relation to Plato. Likewise, the essay does not attend to how Melville would have received Plato through German Idealism (aside from repeating the usual anecdote about Melville's transatlantic conversation about metaphysics with George Adler in 1849), or Emersonian/Transcendentalist rewritings of Neo-Platonism, instead turning its focus on affinities between Melville and Nietzsche regarding nihilism. While the section on Nietzsche is provocative and in itself informative, the essay moves too quickly over its profundities, and one is left wanting a more specific investigation of Melville in relation to Plato or Nietzsche.

Edward Mooney's contribution offers a series of short and densely packed meditations revolving around notions of passion, reverie, disaster, and joy: in short, as Mooney tells us, "what philosophers learn at sea." Mooney, perhaps in contradistinction to Anderson, argues, "Melville can soar into mystic realms, but he's not a Platonist" (50), even if he will later concede Ishmael performs a kind of Platonic care for the embodied soul for his bed-mate Queequeg. For Mooney, "amongness" is rendered poetically in terms of the "sociable" waves and a "metaphysics of intimate abundance," if not more directly in the modes of camaraderie and affectionate address which accent Moby-Dick. Mooney places Melville in a tradition -- or anti-tradition -- of poetic philosophers like Montaigne, Thoreau, Nietzsche or Cavell "who seek episodic, non-universal felt-realities where discrete individuals prosper or fail, see poorly or see well, find eloquence or boredom, move forward or backward, or just trudge in place" (49). In this way, Mooney understands Melville's philosophy as the enactment or essaying of ideas through literary embodiments. What is more, his chapter itself follows such an episodic philosophical method, often relying on evocation, poetic interlude, or even Shakespearean dialogue rather than logical development. What sailors know, then, is not the self-assured knowing of a philosophical system, but the unknowing of the sea, its capacity to submerge and rend subjects, yet at once its potential to effect the "eternal mildness of joy" which Ishmael experiences.

In "Outlandish Lands," Jason M. Wirth argues that Melville's Pierre -- given its setting as a "landlocked" novel -- might be thought to dramatize Melville's philosophical inlandness as opposed to the unmeasured infinities of the sea of his earlier novels. Yet, Wirth cleverly inverts this inlandness to show Pierre as an "outlandish" text, insofar as it probes the metaphysical groundlessness of Pierre's "abyssal soul," if not the great ambiguity at the heart of human affairs and desires" (69, 67). Wirth thus offers a welcome revision of the usual doxa that Pierre is a failed novelistic experiment, taking it rather as a profound exemplum of Melville's honesty regarding "the tragic dimension of ethical life" (67). This is a necessary dimension if we are to understand what it means to be among and with, and thus speaks directly to Melville's continued philosophical importance. As Wirth powerfully writes:

An ethical disposition furthermore demands honesty and a willingness to take on the moral hypocrisy, constitutive self-deception, and democratic failures that pass for a virtuous life in this culture. The promise of a new, more inclusive, and philosophically deliberative manner of being together -- the fragile hope of a real democracy -- has so far been squandered by the racism, misogyny, genocidal appropriation, and market-driven intoxication that is the shared psychosis of American life. Melville's ethical disposition is no doubt offensive in its honesty about our constitutive delusions, but it confronts these delusions with an almost prophetic candor. (68)

Wirth expands on his assertion of this ethical dimension, as a "new, more inclusive, and philosophically deliberative manner of being together," in terms of Pierre's silences, its "de-familiarization" of the democratic patriarchal family that the novel explores through Pierre's purported incest with Isabel, as well as the movement of Deleuze's deterritorialization (which Deleuze himself found in Melville's figure of the "outlandish").

Like Wirth, Gary Shapiro follows a line of deterritorialization to outlandish lands in his "geophilosophical" reading of Melville's "The Encantadas, or the Enchanted Isles," a series of sketches regarding the Galapagos Islands. Yet, Shapiro pairs Deleuze's interest in desert islands to Derrida's reading of Defoe's Robinson Crusoe (from his The Beast and the Sovereign lectures), also a key intertext for Melville's sketches. Derrida's anti-totalizing motto "there is no world, only islands" serves as a refrain for the essay, in which Shapiro wants to rethink "The Encantadas" in archipelagic terms. This has aesthetic, taxonomical and political dimensions: first, in terms of Melville's anti-picturesque style, which seeks to disperse the settled complacencies of the eighteenth-century British picturesque as an aristocratic aesthetics of nature; then, his anti-taxonomical re-ordering of the natural hierarchy in the text's natural historical episodes; and, finally, in his dramatizations of perversions of sovereignty in Oberlus and the Dog-King, for whom sovereignty remains subversively linked to its "grotesque variations" (101). Shapiro's contribution therefore nicely adds to the growing work on "The Encantadas," even if we could have hoped for more to have been said regarding the ecological implications of this Melvillean geo-philosophy.

The first half of the volume ends with Tracy Strong's chapter "On Religion and the Strangeness of Speech," which returns us to Melville's early South Sea romances, Typee and Omoo, to think through questions of religious language, silence, identity and conversion. Strong's interest in these texts is astutely marked by the recognition of what he calls Melville's "anthropological modesty," a modesty that acknowledges the unknowability of an other's religious practices, if not the inscrutability of such practices even to those who practice a religion. The "Peep" of Typee's subtitle ("A Peep at Polynesian Life") contains more, then, than a clever alliteration and assonance, but stands for an observational stylistics of the novel's first-person narration, as well as an ethical sensitivity to the other as infinitely (in a Levinasian sense) and irreducibly other. While Strong relates this to Melville's oft-invoked criticisms of Western imperial expansion of Christianity into the South Pacific, it finds more specific, if existentially unnerving, bearing in terms of the practices of face tattooing which Tommo, Typee's narrator, is at pains to avoid. Tommo's fear of having his face tattooed is the fear of loss of self-identity (as Western, Christian, white, male), and with it a concomitant fear of the loss of a language to express the self. Like several others in the volume, but here in a theological key, Strong explores how silence, ineffability and failure serve as ontological conditions for Melville's literary-philosophical Weltanshauung.

Chapters seven through ten explore Melville's philosophical "inheritors" in a decidedly political way. Marilyn Nissim-Sabat (one of the two female contributors) undertakes a "critical reflection" on Melville's phenomenology of gender in terms of two central postcolonial texts, C. L. R. James's Mariners, Renegades, Castaways and Paget Henry's Caliban's Reason. Nissim-Sabat reads in Henry a "poeticist" riposte to James's strident Marxist historicist reading of Ahab as the paradigmatic expression of the telos of Western capitalist egotism -- a reading of Ahab that proscribes the unifying premodern, mythic dimensions of the human that might escape the historicist purview. That is, she argues that Ahab can also be read as an embodiment of "the struggle to reconnect with the primordial sources of the human, that is, the struggle to become whole" (132). This implies a wholeness that does not risk excluding the maternal as James's Mariners does, despite James's calls for the full emancipation of women elsewhere. Taking Ahab's "fire speech" from the chapter "The Candles" as her focus, and linking it to a discussion of Husserl's phenomenology, Nissim-Sabat discerns a maternal force in Moby-Dick that goes beyond the father principle. Yet Ahab, given his "compulsive masculinity," ostensibly does not embrace this force, nor the masculine-feminine duplicities of his inner ego, and rather reacts violently against any possibilities of (maternal, feminine) compassion. Nissim-Sabat's provocative reflections, by reading back through Melville's Caribbean inheritors to Ahab, open a possibility for bringing a new ensemble of ideas to bear on Moby-Dick, in terms of postcolonial writing, African spiritualism, phenomenology and gender studies.

In turn, Kris Sealey, a scholar of Levinas and Sartre, here works to position Moby-Dick among recent interventions in decolonial theory. Again, questions of the meaning of community are at stake: she asks, "what are the possibilities for community when we begin with the question of difference?" (150). To answer, and in a manner similar to Nissim-Sabat, Sealey reads Moby-Dick through Homi Bhabha's figure of the "archaic" and Edouard Glissant's notions of "composite difference" and a "logic of errantry," wherein the "ontology of management and control gives way to unpredictable and creative movement, chaos and lived difference" (150). This amounts to a decolonial conception of difference that can deracinate both the archaic force of imperial whiteness which the whale embodies, and the mechanisms of silencing difference endemic to colonialism and nationalism which it symbolizes. Although Queequeg does not survive the vortex into which The Pequod sinks, his coffin is borne up -- and bears up Ishmael. This, for Sealey, signifies a haunting indigeneity to which Ishmael survives to give voice. Sealey's engagement with Glissant and communities of difference and singularities serve to link her chapter to other exciting recent work by Lorna Burns or Birgit M. Kaiser, work that takes up the notion of postcolonial writing in relation to Deleuze and Melville, and beyond.

In his well-informed and forceful contribution, Eduardo Mendieta analyzes the multiple narrative temporalities of Benito Cereno by drawing on Eric J. Sundquist's extraction of the concept of the "chronotope" from Mikhail Bakhtin in his seminal reading of the novella in To Wake the Nations: Race in the Making of American Literature (Harvard 1998). In so doing, Mendieta links what he calls the "chronotope of slavery," its temporal-spatial form, to the three interrelated subject positions dramatized in the story (Delano, Cereno, and silenced Babo), as an elaborate theatrical performance of the self-blindness of white racist consciousness. As Mendieta writes, "The San Dominick is the stage on which Melville enacts the chronotope in which white racist consciousness is entangled with the ruse of slavery's ideological edifice, with its attendant legal, political, economic, and affective institutions" (175). In Benito Cereno's theatre, that is, Melville can subtly dissect "the repressive and self-obfuscating character" of the white racist mind, for whom Amasa Delano serves a primary conceptual persona; and for which Babo, decapitated and silenced, becomes the "death mask of genocidal slavery" (185). Through Babo's enigmatic silence, Mendieta argues that Melville posits another freedom that exceeds the Hegelian freedom of an imprisoned master, and indeed gestures toward an excess that goes beyond the Hegelian master-slave dialectic. Rather, "the freedoms the slave dreams of is of a different character than the freedom the white master enjoys" (185).

Finally, David LaRocca returns us to Melville's conceptual persona par excellence, namely Bartleby, easily the Melville character who has garnered the single greatest amount of recent European philosophical attention, from Agamben to Žižek. Yet here LaRocca focuses on Jacques Rancière's reading of Deleuze reading Bartleby in order to ask to what extent this attention which European philosophers have given to Melville has served to legitimate Melville to American philosophers. (LaRocca thus implicates Cavell, who famously draws on Nietzsche and Heidegger to "recover" Emerson for American philosophy). Why must we turn to European thinkers to endorse the philosophicality of American works? Why can't we read "Bartleby" as a philosophico-literary text in a similar way that we might read Nietzsche's Zarathustra? Central to LaRocca's discussion is Deleuze's registration of Bartleby's famous reiterations of non-preference (as it breaks down the structure of willing), and his dissolution of the paternal function in the name of a fatherless politics of fraternity which might arise in its wake. Yet Rancière is not content to deduce a Deleuzian politics of fraternity from Bartleby, insofar as the archipelago of brothers or the "wall of loose uncemented stones" (a figure Deleuze borrows from Melville's journal from January 1857 about the stone walls of Jerusalem) presents not merely a Deleuzian politics of singularity but also an impasse or aporia to any future politics. Put differently, how can Bartleby's seeming indifferentism endorse a politics of difference? Instead of answering this head on, LaRocca takes Rancière's skepticism regarding the deducing of a Deleuzian politics from Bartleby as evidence that American thought has not yet gotten over its "daddy problem," a problem that has been around at least since Emerson's "American Scholar." Are Americans merely orphans who have forgotten, or repressed, their founding (or foundling) fathers? But we might as well ask the opposite question, too, given the dynamic of European legitimization of American thought which LaRocca identifies. Namely, haven't European philosophers, insofar as they have repeatedly turned to Melville's Bartleby as conceptual persona, sought their legitimacy in American literature? One could think of Kevin Attell's ingenious work on contemporary Continental philosophers' readings of Bartleby in Jason Frank's A Political Companion to Herman Melville (Kentucky, 2013) (uncited by LaRocca), in which he demonstrates how Bartleby, that blankness that he is, often serves a screen to project, develop, perform, and indeed legitimize their philosophical systems. Or one could think of the series of philosophical concepts that American philosophers have bequeathed to their European inheritors, from Emerson's gaya scienza finding a new style in Nietzsche, to Melville's figure of the outlandish in Deleuze's deterritorialization.

The volume concludes with a short "Afterword" by Cornel West, who lauds the various contributors while at the same time providing a passionate plea to take Melville's philosophy seriously. While perhaps the "renaissance" of philosophical readings of Melville among literary scholars has been long underway (again to point to works by Cameron, Arsić, Marrs or William Spanos, the latter of whom West holds in high regard), West is right to decry the near complete absence of Melville among professional philosophers in American universities. For West, this is catastrophic, especially as "we live in the age of Melville -- an age of spiritual blackout and moral meltdown against the backdrop of an American empire in cultural collapse and political breakdown" (213). (Or, as West later succinctly puts it, "as we enter a neofascist era" (220)). How can, West inveighs, professional American philosophers maintain their relevancy if they do not probe the questions Melville puts to America and to philosophy? How can they remain pertinent, culturally and intellectually, if they do not take seriously Melville's untimely evisceration of the America he lived in, and his timely evisceration of our own era? These are no minor questions, and it is a credit to the strength of the collection and to its editors that West poses them here. Further, in reading West's reflections, especially regarding Nissim-Sabat's essay on Ahab in conjunction with Mendieta's searing critique of racist white consciousness in Benito Cereno, one might also be tempted to say we have perhaps been wrong all along about Ahab. Perhaps we should not confront the violent specter of whiteness with serene optimism and Ishmaelian jocose whimsy, but should muster an Ahabian monomaniacal rage against the whiteness that has kept the American political experiment from exorcising its contradictory and genocidal impulses? That might be saying too much here, but it gives pause to think: what forms of unflinching dedication and courage, if not uniformly directed anger, could we find in Ahab to avenge the specter of white racism once and for all?

On the whole, Melville among the Philosophers is a powerful assertion of Melville's philosophical import. Contributors rightly place Melville in conversation with Plato, Emerson, Nietzsche, James, or Deleuze, and the essays in the collection that deal with religious studies, race, decolonization and gender in Melville's work open promising avenues for his continued relevance. However, while its philosophic attention to Typee, Pierre, Clarel, and "The Encantadas" is certainly welcome and necessary, the volume's silences regarding Mardi and The Confidence-Man give us an incomplete picture of Melville's development as a philosophic novelist. There is likewise much more to say regarding shorter fictions like "The Apple-Tree Table," "The Piazza," or Billy Budd; and, the investigations of Clarel's poetic-philosophy could certainly have been buttressed by more in-depth engagements with Melville's later poetry, from Battle-Pieces to his late Timoleon and posthumous Weeds and Wildings. With the exception of the introduction, the volume frequently misses key opportunities to engage with germane and important work being done by philosophically informed literary scholars regarding issues of subjectivity, the human, ecology, queer studies, impersonality, materiality, or temporality. Nonetheless, the book still stands as an important call to undertake further cutting-edge studies of the rich complexities and potentialities Melville's work. The time of Melville's philosophical silencing has now passed, and the work incumbent is to find in Melville new philosophical resources to counterforce our entrance into a neofascist era, as well as new Melvilles for the struggles to come. What Melville says of Shakespeare and modern writers in his review of Hawthorne's Mosses might be true of Melville's future critics too: "The trillionth part has not yet been said; and all that has been said, but multiplies the avenues to what remains to be said."