Memory: A History

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Dmitri Nikulin (ed.), Memory: A History, Oxford University Press, 2015, 397pp., $35 (pbk), ISBN 9780199793846.

Reviewed by Kimberly Rivers, University of Wisconsin Oshkosh


The prestige and value of memory as a concept in many fields of study has never been higher. One has only to peruse the selections anthologized in The Collective Memory Reader to get a sense of the vast array of approaches to the topic.[1] In fact, according to Dmitri Nikulin, the editor of the present volume, the burgeoning state of memory studies in philosophy, psychology, neuroscience, sociology, cultural studies, literature, and history since the 1980s has occasioned a kind of "memory fatigue" that renders the term almost meaningless and necessitates a "clarification of the range of the concept's historical meaning" (4). The goal of the book is to get at what memory is by providing a history of how it has been used as a philosophical concept. The book comprises eight major chapters, written by eminent scholars, that trace the history of memory from ancient philosophy, through the medieval and the early modern periods, to classical German, continental, and analytic philosophy. Two of the chapters deal with trauma and memory and with cultural memory, both recent preoccupations in the field of collective memory inaugurated by Maurice Halbwachs' Les Cadres sociaux de la mémoire.[2]

Given that the treatment of memory in philosophy hardly exhausts the topic, the volume also includes, after each main chapter, a short "reflection" on memory in another discipline. This is an innovative method of incorporating different perspectives, though some of the inclusions function as reflections more compellingly than others: "Memory and Forgetfulness in Daoism," by Xia Chen, and "Memory and Story-Telling in Proust," by Mieke Bal, are notable in this regard. The last three on Freud, modern psychology, and collective memory are perhaps the most fruitful because they expand on what have been the major preoccupations of twentieth-century innovations in memory theory outside the field of philosophy.

The editor and contributors provide the continuity often lacking in such collections by focusing on three common themes in their individual chapters: memory as the object of philosophy of mind (i.e. memory as a major cognitive faculty), as a mnemonic art, and as the foundation of cultural studies (commemoration) (4-5). Though the traces of continuity are present throughout the book, the authors leave it to the reader to pick up on them. This is a rich collection and valuable for anyone seeking to explore the dependence of recent developments in memory studies on philosophical thought. As few scholars are likely to be conversant with the treatment of memory in every period from antiquity to the twenty-first century, there is something new here for everyone. Since it is impossible to explore the ideas in all of these essays, I will concentrate on the early chapters and on some of the implications of the three themes.

Nikulin contributes both the introduction to the volume and the first chapter on "Memory in Ancient Philosophy." In the introduction, rather than providing the usual synopsis of the individual contributions, Nikulin gives an overview of the field of memory studies. He begins by suggesting two reasons for memory's prominence in modernity: first, that the fall from grace of the Enlightenment conception of reason has allowed memory to take its place as the pre-eminent human capacity, and second, that memory's transformation from a merely personal ability to a collective one has become a way for societies to process shared trauma and produce new history (5). He then explores the ancient distinction between memory (mnēmē) as a capacity to store and reproduce events and things we have experienced or learned from others and recollection (anamnēsis) as a process to recall a thing or event through a series of reasoned steps (7). The rest of the introduction traces that distinction in nine issues that recur in memory studies: mnemonics; memory and recollection in autobiography; collective, cultural, and historical memory; historical memory; memory and trauma; the truth of memory; the media of memory; being as being in memory; and forgetting/oblivion. Since many of the later chapters presuppose a familiarity with 20th- and 21st-century theories of collective and cultural memory that not all readers may possess, this essay provides an excellent initial foray into the material.

In terms of the three stated themes, only Nikulin's chapter on memory in ancient philosophy integrates all of them. He begins with an explanation of the origins of the art of memory, recalling the story of the poet Simonides' invention of the system of places and images after a dinner party at which the ceiling collapsed, disfiguring the guests so badly that they could not be identified. By recalling the faces of the guests and their places at the table, Simonides achieved the insight that order and images were the key to a good memory (36). The art of memory was widely known and practiced in antiquity and the medieval period, supplying an aid to individual memory in public speaking, poetry, and rhetoric.

Nikulin also insightfully explores memory's role in ancient poetry and history. For the Greeks in the archaic period, there was no concept of personal immortality, only the idea of fame (kleos) (an idea picked up by Nietzsche and discussed in a later chapter). Fame could be transmitted through personal and cultural memory. In such a society, it was important not only to act properly but also to remember well (the ethical imperative of memory is thus not a recent conception). Since an individual memory can fail, society needs a cultural mechanism of transmitting memory; for the Greeks this occurred through epic poetry and history (38-39). The distinction between poetry and history, according to Aristotle, was between what could be and what actually happened, between the universal and the particular (42).

Finally, Nikulin analyzes the accounts of memory in the thought of Plato, Aristotle, the Stoics, Roman rhetoric, and Plotinus. Because Plato's and Aristotle's concepts of memory and recollection in cognitive psychology establish the basis for the first three chapters and in some ways the whole book ("Plato" is the single most-cited term in the index), Nikulin's contribution is especially valuable. It was Plato who established the importance of remembering in philosophical thought, regarding it as the basis of knowledge. One recollects things one already knows, and this knowledge can be remembered through dialectics, the art of asking the right questions (52). If Plato established the importance of memory, it was Aristotle who sought to explain how it worked, with most of his ideas set out in the De memoria et reminscentia. Aristotle understood the mind as having faculties or capacities to perform tasks, with both imagination and memory having a role to play and both using images in their functions (60). What was never completely clear was the exact nature of these images, which sometimes seemed like a sort of picture and other times more like a motion. One of the issues that Aristotle left to posterity to determine was memory's relationship to thinking. Aristotle argued that memory was not thinking and that it belonged to the part of the soul that he called "primary sense perception." It was thus associated with the sensible rather than the intellective part of the soul. Philosophers would spend the next thousand years or so working out this relationship.

The succeeding chapters choose to highlight one or two of the three major themes. Jörn Müller's chapter "Memory in Medieval Philosophy" concisely details the main issues,concentrating on Augustine's views on memory as an aspect of mind, on Aristotelian ideas of memory (rather than reminiscence/ recollection) as mediated by the Arabs, and on memory in the scholastic era (mainly Albert the Great and Thomas Aquinas). Müller follows Mary Carruthers in viewing the Middle Ages as "fundamentally memorial" and thinks that the philosophical conceptions of memory have been understudied, with only Janet Coleman's Ancient and Medieval Memories covering the whole period.[3] He begins with Augustine's notions of memory in Book Ten of the Confessions. For Augustine sensible memories are not the product of the body but rather a product of the mind. One can have memories of things that one has not personally experienced, such as memories of the city of Alexandria. For him, memory is not dependent on images but is actually present in the mind. His views are discussed by philosophers throughout the medieval period.

The second line of philosophical influence on memory came through the Arab philosophers, Avicenna and Averroes, who began with Aristotle's De memoria et reminscentia and developed his ideas about memory. They turned memory into an internal sense (along with the common sense, imagination, the imaginative/cogitative faculty, and estimation) and intermingled Aristotelian ideas with Platonic concepts, creating tension in their overall understanding of memory (102). According to Müller, the originality of their thought lies in a new class of objects that Aristotle did not have. For them, imagination received the contents from the common sense and retained them, while memory stored the intentions received by the estimation: "As for the intention, it is a thing which the soul perceives from the sensed object without its previously having been perceived by the external sense, just as the sheep perceives the intention of harm in the wolf, which causes it to fear the wolf and to flee from it" (103). Averroes disliked estimation and thought it an unnecessary addition. For him, memory perceives as well as stores. Memory is the most spiritual of the internal senses as each sense strips away some aspect of the image, taking away the husk and leaving the kernel, which is what memory gets.

Where the difficulties came in for the Arabs (as well as for many later thinkers) was in the question of how memory interacted with the intellect. In Avicenna's system, the human soul cannot store previously acquired intellectual knowledge, so he distinguished between the possible intellect and the agent intellect. The possible one is actualized (i.e. gets content) with help from the latter. The agent intellect came to be understood not as part of the soul but rather as a transcendent entity that functions like a universal transmitter for all individuals. The possible intellect receives intelligibles from this entity; it does not store them, but keeps a "knowing that" habitus that allows it to get better and faster every time it receives forms. Like Avicenna, Averroes also denied that there is an intellectual memory.

Müller stresses that it was Albert the Great who grasped the fundamental tensions in the Arab views of the internal senses and began to resolve them by focusing on Aristotle's notions of recollection, which Müller thinks the Arabs had neglected. Albert understood Aristotle's ideas of recollection to be an intellectual process of a reasoned search, much like a syllogism. To elucidate Aristotle's thoughts, Albert turned to Cicero's discussions of the art of memory as the best example of a trained memory and an aid to reminiscence. After Albert, Aquinas developed the best synthesis of the theories available at the time. He rejected the agent intellect that even Albert had retained because he required a unified memory to fit with his anthropology of a union of mind and body. Both Albert and Aquinas in their theories of recollection also saw a time dimension in memory that earlier theorists had ignored. For them, memory became a part of prudence and had an ethical dimension. Although Müller, like most modern commentators on the art of memory, thinks that Frances Yates's claims about the ethical dimensions of memory in the two Dominican philosophers were a bit overblown, he does think her essential insight was correct.[4] This insight establishes for the medieval period an ethical role for memory that has been so important in recent theories.

The value of this chapter lies in how clearly Müller points out the places of conflict between the Augustinian, Arabic, and Aristotelian systems. He also sets up the problem of how memory works in intellection for the next chapter. His synopsis of ideas at the end of the chapter is the clearest depiction of these issues that I have encountered. However, unlike Nikulin, Müller deliberately avoids much mention of the "practices" of memory, by which he seems to mean mnemotechnics and commemoration (93). Leaving out a discussion of memoria as commemoration of the dead is a missed opportunity to connect with the themes of history and commemoration laid out in Nikulin's chapters and in the later contributions of the volume.[5] The myriad ways in which the living in the late Middle Ages saw themselves in communication with the dead were so great that A. N. Galpern has seen pre-Reformation Catholicism as "a cult of the living in service of the dead."[6] Given the importance of memory to medieval ideas of history and commemoration, it might have been worth adding another section on medieval memoria or changing the subject of that chapter's Reflection to history instead of art.

One of the benefits of examining the broad sweep of conceptions of memory is that the big turning points emerge clearly. One such turning point occurred in the early modern period. Stephen Clucas's analysis in his chapter "Memory in the Renaissance and Early Modern Period" traces how the modification of Aristotle's faculty psychology, combined with changes in the art of memory, led to a search for the key to universal knowledge. Like Müller, Clucas refers to Carruthers's insight that medieval culture was profoundly memorial, but he modifies her claim that the early modern period ushered in documentary culture. Instead he notes that the invention of printing actually deepened memorial culture, at least initially as a philosophical concept (131). Humanist thinkers fastened on to the art of memory as a mechanism to perfect human mental powers, thinking that mnemonics ennobled memory. From the theory of places and images, order was singled out as the key and was incorporated by Ramus and Melanchthon into their own dialectic, a new kind of memory art that could help to link all of the arts together. Ramus assumed that such a system would let one get at the underlying principles of the world and would better support memory because dialectics came not from an external order, as in the art of memory, but from an order innate to the things themselves (147). The search for a logical way of ordering knowledge became part of the goal of pansophia or the encyclopedic project to unify all fields of knowledge.

It is at the end of this period, in Locke's theories, that one sees a transformation of memory. As philosophers lost their interest in mnemonics and its fundamental importance in the encyclopedic plans of the time, the concept of memory become fundamental to personal identity. Clucas argues that there was a "shift in the memory concept from one of knowledge acquisition to one of self-knowledge." The encyclopedia of the Enlightenment becomes the "'archive of a collective memory' rather than a utopian means to attain individual omniscience" (174). It is at this point that discussions of the art of memory disappear from consideration in the philosophic analysis of memory.

This new understanding of memory as the key to personal identity was then explored in classical German philosophy. According to Angelica Nuzzo, in her chapter "Forms of Memory in Classical German Philosophy," with Kant's developmental of transcendental philosophy, memory goes from being a psychological faculty to the engine that grounds the structure of subjectivity (188). Subsequent German philosophers like Schelling and Fichte emphasized Erinnerung (recollection) over Gedächtnis (memory). As in antiquity and the Middle Ages, the recollecting function was seen as the higher faculty, and it became "the constitutive activity of consciousness."

It is also in this time period that the planks were laid for the development of ideas about collective memory. Nuzzo sees concepts about the relationship between memory and history and the issue of the collective and ethical dimensions of history as arising in the nineteenth century, especially in Hegel's thought, though the specific issues would only be explored in the 20th-century (210). In the Phenomenology of the Spirit (written in 1807), Hegel recognized the idea of a collective memory that had an ethical dimension, which Nuzzo thinks can be seen in the relationship of the death of an individual to the community (214-15). Memory is the memory of the dead; memory preserves what is gone but also is the thing that declares the dead, dead. It is memory that pulls out from the meaningless swirl of past events and figures what is worthy of collective remembrance; it is these functions that give memory an ethical dimension.

The ethical imperative to remember the dead is followed in several of the later chapters, and Nikulin notes that scholars have posited an ethics of memory. It becomes our duty to remember the suffering of others. This obligation is also rooted in ideas of commemoration and cultural memory. In his chapter "Trauma, Memory, Holocaust," Michael Rothberg draws on the 2001 memoir Still Alive: A Holocaust Girlhood Remembered by Ruth Klüger to explore how those three notions, far from being inevitably linked, came together in the late 20th century as "matters of concern." The notion that we must remember the Holocaust in order to ensure that it never happens again can quickly become banal. Like Klüger, he strains to discover a method of explaining the Holocaust through comparisons. The difficulty is to get at the particularities of people's experiences; there was not just one way to experience it. Rothberg proposes multidirectional memory, seeking to make people's experiences relational without sacrificing specificity (289-90).

Another exploration of the implications of collective memory is Axel Honneth's reflection "The Recognitional Structure of Collective Memory," which traces how membership of groups seeking to create a collective identity, and thus a collective memory, is established. Unlike with individual memory, in groups there will necessarily be a plurality of perspectives; the group must decide which ones will be remembered collectively. Like Halbwachs before him, Honneth begins with the family and then moves on to larger societal groups. The question of who is a member of a group, even of a family, is constantly negotiated as membership changes. In a family, membership extends to those who are dead and to future family members. This acknowledgement that the family contains more than merely the members who are alive is what Honneth means by "a relationship of recognition that stretches both into the past and into the future" (318).

Honneth extends the same notion to other kinds of groups, such as social movements, unions, or states, in which the question of membership is subject to far more negotiation and is often a matter of a "hegemonic culture of memory . . . against which minorities struggle and set up their own memories" (322). These struggles become most apparent in questions of victims and perpetrators and clearly have relevance to the issues discussed by Rothberg. If the present group agrees that a subset has the status of a victim, then the subset becomes part of the group. In addition, when a group deliberates over whether an event should be collectively remembered, it makes a binding decision about what kind of collective it wants to be. This kind of decision necessarily involves the future as well as the present and the past (324). "In a group like this, neither have all the dead died, nor are those not yet born absent among the living." His observations about group membership are not dissimilar to medieval memoria, in which it was incumbent among the future members of the late medieval society to cultivate the memoria of the dead and those who would soon die through rituals, prayers, and monuments.

The volume concludes with an essay by the well-known theorist Jan Assmann "Memory and Culture." His piece clarifies his and Aleida Assmann's theories of communicative and cultural memory. Responding to critics arguing that collective memory cannot exist because memory requires a mind (331-32), he declares that objects like Proust's madeleine, feasts, icons, and the like can trigger the memories that a group has invested in them. Groups do not have a memory but they may make a memory by creating monuments (332). For him human memory is not only embodied but also embedded in social and cultural frames. Assmann also distinguishes between communicative and cultural memory, relegating to communicative memory the memory that one shares with one's contemporaries and which can be the subject of living discourse and oral history. Reaching back only 80 years, it encompasses what Halbwachs had seen as collective memory. Cultural memory, on the other hand, covers the past "as it is remembered and inhabited," which is what a society or group still considers relevant to the present. It is not the same thing as history, about which Assmann appears to have grave misgivings (334).

In fact, it is when Assmann attempts to distinguish between historical memory and history that he ventures onto perhaps controversial ground. He relies on Nietzsche's On the Uses and Abuses of History to set up the distinction. As noted in Nicolas de Warren's chapter "Memory in Continental Philosophy," Nietzsche envisaged three forms of history: the monumental, the antiquarian, and the critical. For each type, he saw a positive use in "service for life" for "the man of action" as well as a negative one. In Assmann's analysis, what Nietzsche deemed a positive use corresponds to what Assmann sees as historical memory and what was deemed an abuse corresponds to history. Assmann thinks historical memory has a continuity with the past, while history has a "radical discontinuity" and "presupposes the pastness of the past." Assmann ends on a negative note, declaring that the links between history and identity have been severed and "historical knowledge turned into a rapidly growing mass of abstract and objective, disconnected and disembodied information" (349).

What Memory: A History decisively demonstrates is that our current obsession with memory has a history. Philosophers and writers in western thought since the Greeks have struggled over what to remember, how to remember it, and what we mean when say we are remembering it. Though there are hints in Augustine's Confessions of our modern conviction that self-identity lies in memory, it was the moment when humans became less concerned with preserving knowledge and learning with their memories that they could concentrate on what memory meant for self-knowledge. It took longer to explore philosophically how people could remember in groups, though the duty to do so was implicit in ancient poetry and in the medieval cult of the dead. As we have outsourced our dependence on memory as a storage facility for knowledge to ever more capacious forms of media, we have come to value memory's powers for self-understanding and identity ever more highly. The same has been true for memory's estimation in cultural understanding and identity, as societies struggle over which groups' memories of the past will be remembered and commemorated.

[1] Jeffrey K. Olick, Vered Vinitzky-Seroussi, and Daniel Levy, eds., The Collective Memory Reader (Oxford University Press, 2011).

[2] This work is most easily accessed for English speakers in Maurice Halbwachs, On Collective Memory, ed. Donald N. Levine, trans. Lewis A. Coser, The Heritage of Sociology (The University of Chicago Press, 1992).

[3] Mary Carruthers, The Book of Memory: A Study of Memory in Medieval Culture, 2nd ed. (Cambridge University Press, 2008); Janet Coleman, Ancient and Medieval Memories. Studies in the Reconstruction of the Past (Cambridge University Press, 1992). Another excellent discussion of ancient and medieval attitudes toward memory can be found in Sabine Heimann-Seelbach, Ars und scientia: Genese, Überlieferung und Funktionen der mnemotechnischen Traktatliteratur im 15. Jahrhundert; mit Edition und Untersuchung dreier deutscher Traktate und ihrer lateinischen Vorlagen, Frühe Neuzeit, Bd. 58 (Niemeyer, 2000).

[4] Frances A. Yates, The Art of Memory (The University of Chicago Press, 1966), Chap. 8.

[5] Truus van Bueren and Andrea van Leerdam, Care for the Here and the Hereafter: Memoria, Art and Ritual in the Middle Ages (Brepols, 2005). Otto Gerhard Oexle, "Memoria und kulturelles Gedächtnis. Kulturwissenschaftliche Ausblicke auf Mittelalter und Moderne," Quaestiones medii aevi novae 8 (2003): 3-24.

[6] Bruce Gordon and Peter Marshall, The Place of the Dead: Death and Remembrance in Late Medieval and Early Modern Europe (Cambridge University Press, 2000), 3.