Memory: A Self-Referential Account

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Jordi Fernández, Memory: A Self-Referential Account, Oxford University Press, 2019, 221pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190073008.

Reviewed by Sven Bernecker, University of Cologne/University of California, Irvine


Jordi Fernández has written a thought-provoking study on episodic memory, full of intricate analysis and argument and containing many interesting ideas and insightful observations. Even though the study deals with a vast range of issues, it is surprisingly coherent. The central idea is what he used to call the 'self-reflexive view of episodic memory content' and what he now calls the 'self-referential account.' According to the self-referential account, episodic memories involve causal relations to past perceptual experiences and beliefs about the past. Moreover, episodic memories represent themselves as having a certain causal origin. What Fernández has to say about the phenomenology of episodic memory (part ii) and the epistemology of episodic memory (part iii) all relies on the self-referential account.

Chapter 2 defends the so-called 'functionalist theory of memory,' which bears some resemblance to the well-known causal theory of memory due to Martin and Deutscher (1966). The causal theory of memory has it that for a subject to remember that p, her present representation of p must stand in an appropriate causal relation to her past representation of p or of a proposition sufficiently similar to p. The functionalist theory of memory is characterized as follows:

for any subject S and proposition p, S remembers that p just in case S has some mental image i such that i tends to cause in S a disposition to believe both that p and that S experienced that p, and i tends to be caused in S by having experienced that p. (49)

Like the causal theory of memory, the functionalist theory requires that an episodic memory tends to be caused by the subject's past experience of the remembered event. What distinguishes the functionalist theory from the causal theory is that it does not require that the mental state actually be caused by the experience.

The causal theory of memory, Fernández argues, is both too strict and too weak. It is too strict because it does not allow for the generation of new content during reconstructive remembering. Consider the following case of content generation: I have a mental image of my father shooting a black rabbit even though, in the past, I saw my father shooting a white rabbit (38). Fernández maintains that this is a genuine case of remembering but that the causal theory is not able to classify it as such. The functionalist account, on the other hand, is able to classify this as a genuine case of remembering because it does not require that the memory actually be caused by the past experience. This criticism of the causal theory does not strike me as compelling. A more straightforward way of dealing with the example at hand is to distinguish between different parts of the ostensible memory content: part of the content is properly remembered (that my father shot a rabbit) and part of it is not (that the rabbit was black).

The causal theory of memory is said to be not only too strict but also be too weak. It is too weak because it does not require that memories are epistemically relevant to the subject, in the sense that the subject is disposed to take them into account when forming judgments about the past (typically by forming a belief that the remembered event occurred). This objection to the causal theory of memory assumes, without argument, that memories are necessarily transparent to the mind.

When one is determining whether someone remembers, one must do so from some point of view. One can work from the point of view of the subject, or from the point of view of an external observer who knows all the relevant facts, some of which may not be available to the subject. Those who adopt the subject's point of view for making these evaluations are internalists, and those who adopt a bird's-eye view are externalists. Fernández is an internalist while causal theorists tend to be externalists (cf. Bernecker 2010: 30-4).

Chapter 3 defends the core idea of the self-referential view of episodic memory content, a view that goes back to Searle who distinguishes two components in the content of an episodic memory. One component is the same content as that of the previous perceptual experience from which the memory causally derives. The other component is an additional element, which is responsible for the difference between perception and memory. Perception represents a present event as present while memory represents a past event as past. The way memory represents a past perceptual experience as past is by representing the present memory as being caused by a past perceptual experience. Searle writes:

The memory of seeing a flower represents both the visual experience and the flower and is self-referential in the sense that, unless the memory was caused by the visual experience which in turn was caused by the presence of (and features of) the flower, I didn't really remember seeing the flower (1983: 95).

Searle maintains that the content of an episodic memory represents (i) the past event, (ii) the relevant past perceptual experience as caused by the event, and (iii) the present memory state itself as caused by the past experience. For reasons that are not relevant here, Fernández changes some of the details of Searle's account (Fernández 2006: 51-3, Recanati 2007: 138-40). On Fernández' version of the view, the content of an episodic memory represents the memory state itself as caused by the veridical past experience. He maintains that "episodic memories represent themselves as having a certain causal history, namely, they represent themselves as coming from past perceptions of objective facts" (Fernández 2016: 636-7).

Given the self-referential view, episodic memories present to us certain facts that were not initially presented to us in the past perceptual experiences. Consider the memory of seeing a flower. The content of the memory represents the fact that the memory state itself is caused by the veridical perception of the flower. But this fact is not part of the content of the past perception. For why would a fact that partly concerns my future be presented to me when I am having a perceptual experience of a flower? The content of episodic memory is therefore richer than the content of the corresponding past perceptual experience.

Chapter 4 deals with the temporal phenomenology of episodic memory. Fernández uses the self-referential view to come up with a novel interpretation of mental time travel, that is, the capacity to mentally reconstruct personal events from the past (episodic memory) as well as to imagine possible scenarios in the future (episodic future thinking). Mental time travel, he argues, does not consist, as is commonly claimed, in re-experiencing a past event but consists, instead, in representing the past experience of the past event (95). This account of mental time travel is supposed to provide a better explanation of the feeling of pastness and the awareness of previous experience.

Chapter 5 develops an 'endorsement model' of the experience of ownership I have toward my episodic memories. According to the endorsement view, I am aware of my episodic memories as being mine in that I have the sense that those memories fit or match the past (120). In other words, the experience of ownership with respect to my episodic memories is due to me endorsing those memories. While this strikes me as a fairly plausible view, Fernández' argument is methodologically problematic in that it crucially relies on Klein and Nichols' (2012) case of R.B. After being hit by a car, forty-three-year-old R.B. suffered physical injuries along with cognitive and memory impairments. R.B.'s autobiographical memories (Klein and Nichols claim) lacked, for a certain period, the sense of 'mineness' usually conveyed by episodic memory. He remembered events from his past without describing these events as having been experienced by him. Fernández takes the case of R.B. to establish the possibility of disowned memories. Yet the case for disowned memories is very weak because there is only a single patient who claims to have experienced them.

Chapter 6 uses the self-referential view of episodic memory content to defend the thesis that judgments we make on the basis of our episodic memories are immune to error through misidentification. The key passage reads:

If the RV [i.e., the self-referential view] is correct, my memory M can only be fully accurate if M causally originates in my experience of seeing [such-and-such]. And if the remembered perceptual experience was indeed my experience, then I am not mistaken in thinking that I am identical with the person who I remember to have seen [such-and-such]. It seems, therefore, that a misidentification error is not possible if memories have the kind of content that is attributed to them by RV. (158-9)

The idea behind this defense of the immunity to error through misidentification is that, according to the self-referential view, my episodic memory carries the information that the past perceptual experience I attribute to myself has been mine. Episodic memories are, in other words, factive with respect to the ownership component of the memory content. This claim strikes me as being reasonable, yet I do not understand why Fernández does not also take the thematic aspect of the memory content to be factive. On the first page of the book he declares that he takes 'memory' non-factively: "it is possible to remember something falsely, and it is possible to have a false memory of something" (3 n1). As far as I can see, Fernández does not provide an argument for why we should endorse the factivity with respect to the attitudinal component of episodic memory contents but not with respect to the thematic component.

Finally, chapter 7 presents an argument for robust epistemic generativism about episodic memory, which is based on the self-referential view. Given the self-referential view, episodic memory presents me with facts that were not initially presented to me in the past perceptual experience -- facts about the causal origin of the episodic memory itself. If episodic memory functions reliably, we are justified in believing the self-referential component of content generated by episodic memory. Whether episodic memory is in fact a reliable faculty is not a question addressed in the book (14).

Before presenting his argument for episodic memory having the status of a generative source of justification and knowledge (in sect. 7.7), Fernández critically discusses other such arguments found in the literature, including my own argument (Bernecker and Grundmann 2019). My argument is said to fail to establish robust epistemic generativism about memory (186-7). I disagree. Memory cannot yield justified belief (knowledge) unless it relies on another reliable source. Yet, granting the epistemic dependence of memory on other epistemic sources such as perception, it does not follow that memory beliefs are justified only by factors that are present independently of memory. Memory depends on, say, perception in that the reliability of perception is necessary for the justifying force of memory. But to say that perception is necessary for the justifying force of memory is different from saying that perception is sufficient for the justification of memory beliefs and that memory does not add anything substantial to the epistemic status of the beliefs it delivers. Robust epistemic generativism about memory, the view I defend, does not claim that memory is an autonomous epistemic source; it does not claim that memory can make something out of nothing. Instead robust generativism claims that memory can make an independent contribution to the prima facie justification of memory beliefs.

As should have become clear from the preceding discussion, the self-referential view is the cornerstone of the entire book. If the content of episodic memory is self-referential in the way Fernández claims, then two memories of the same object, say a red barn, have different contents because the self-referential aspect is different for the two experiences of seeing the red barn. Even if it is granted that phenomenologically identical memories differ in this self-referential way, it is a further question whether they differ in what they represent about what is causing them. How can a memory of a red barn represent that it is caused by a red barn, while a memory of a green barn represent that it is caused by a green barn? How can these memories represent their distinct causes when what these memories represent about their causes is inaccessible to the person having the memory? The memories could be, after all, the same in every phenomenological respect and still be memories of completely different objects (cf. Dretske 2003: 166). The self-referential view remains a mystery.

Fernández has written an ambitious and thought-provoking book. It is a must-read for anyone interested in the philosophy of memory. It is philosophically deep, with many subtle distinctions and arguments that I have not been able to do justice to in the overview given here. This subtlety does not come at the expense of clarity, for the book very readable. It is bound to become one of the classics in the philosophy of memory.


Bernecker, S. (2010). Memory: A Philosophical Study. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Bernecker, S. & Grundmann, T. (2019). Knowledge from Forgetting. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 98: 525-540.

Dretske, F. (2003). The Intentionality of Perception. In B. Smith (ed.), John Searle (pp. 154-168), Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Fernández, J. (2006). The Intentionality of Memory. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 84: 39-57.

Fernández, J. (2016). Epistemic Generation in Memory. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 92: 620-644.

Klein, S.B. & Nichols, S. (2012). Memory and the Sense of Personal Identity. Mind 121: 677-702.

Martin, C.B. & Deutscher, M. (1966). Remembering. Philosophical Review 75: 161-196.

Recanati, F. (2007). Perspectival Thought: A Plea for (Moderate) Relativism. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Searle, J. (1983). Intentionality: An Essay in the Philosophy of Mind. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.