Meno and Phaedo

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Plato, Meno and Phaedo, David Sedley (ed.), and Alex Long (ed., tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2011, xl + 119pp., $16.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521676779.

Reviewed by Josh Wilburn, University of Victoria


This latest volume in the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy series offers a new edition of Plato's Meno and Phaedo, edited by Alex Long and David Sedley. The volume consists of an introduction, suggestions for further reading, translations of the texts, and extensive footnotes throughout. (Long drafted the suggestions for further readings and the translations, we are told, and Sedley the introduction, while the two shared the footnotes and revision of the whole.) The Cambridge series aims at expanding the range and quality of texts in the history of philosophy that are available in English, and, in particular, it aims at doing so for the purposes of student use and in a way that is widely accessible. It is primarily with this objective in mind that I will evaluate the volume. I will comment first on the introduction and then on the translations themselves. Let me say, by way of preface, that on the whole I find this to be an excellent edition of the texts and well-suited for undergraduate use. Critical remarks that follow should, therefore, be understood as pointing out exceptions to the generally high quality of the work.

It should be noted that other recent or relatively recent translations of both Meno and Phaedo are already available and aimed at student use. Phaedo has been translated in a new edition by David Gallop (2009) and Meno by Jane Day (1994) as well as by Adam Beresford and Lesley Brown (2006). Both Meno and Phaedo, moreover, are included together in the excellent Five Dialogues, translated by G. M. A. Grube and recently revised and edited by John Cooper for a second edition (2002). These translations are, by and large, good ones. One might, then, question whether there was a need for this new volume. I will leave that question to the side, however, and will simply focus on evaluating the merits of this edition in its own right.

Sedley's introduction is divided into three sections: one each on Meno and Phaedo and a brief initial section that introduces the reader to Socrates and Plato and outlines the standard chronology of the Platonic dialogues. In this first section, Sedley emphasizes the transition from the "early" dialogues that "attempt to capture and explore the philosophical persona and significance of Socrates" to the "middle" dialogues "in which constructive metaphysical speculation and argument take centre stage." In addition to providing uninitiated readers with background on the development of Platonic philosophy, this section also serves to justify the purported motivation for putting these two dialogues in particular together in this volume: They are being sold as the transitional dialogues in Plato's career, and as the dialogues that, in particular, represent the beginnings of his crucial metaphysical theories of recollection, the Forms, and the immortality of the soul. The back cover to the edition states that Meno and Phaedo illustrate "the birth of Platonic philosophy," and Sedley's own introduction concludes, "In reading our two dialogues, we are witnessing nothing less than the arrival of Platonism itself." While I find this to be a lofty and potentially misleading oversimplification -- because, among other things, there is more to "Platonism" than just the metaphysical theories that are prominently expounded in Meno and Phaedo, and because Platonic philosophy was not "born" in a single moment but rather was being developed all along, even throughout the so-called "early" dialogues -- it is a point that Sedley does not dwell upon. The view underlying it, however, does seem to have one unfortunate effect on the content of the introduction, a point to which I will return shortly.

On the whole, the introduction has much to recommend it. At twenty-five pages, it is extensive enough to allow for a meaningful and reasonably thorough first look at the dialogues. Although it should be helpful to students of all levels, its audience is clearly meant to include students and readers who have no prior knowledge of the dialogues or even of Platonic philosophy. To that end Sedley is largely successful. He provides straightforward, understandable summaries of the dialogues and their main arguments, and he is careful to explain key concepts, philosophical ideas, and historical references as they are introduced. He provides a clear and succinct explanation of what the Forms are, for example, and at apposite points in the introduction he explains who the sophists were, the principle of Priority of Definition, and what Socratic irony is. Sedley also discusses important Greek terms whose translations do not capture their full meanings, including psuchê and aretê (and, in a footnote, didakton). Moreover, he takes care to mention background philosophical assumptions or views when it would be useful to know them, and he draws attention to important themes and issues in the texts and points out connections to other Platonic dialogues, thus providing readers with a way of orienting themselves within Plato's thought and prompting them to engage in further, independent thinking about the material. Finally, the introduction is largely free of agenda. Sedley summarizes the dialogues in a reasonably neutral way, and where there are significant controversies or interpretive issues, he usually flags them as such. A useful timeline and an up-to-date (if somewhat short) list of suggestions for further reading nicely supplement the introduction.

There are, however, a few exceptions to the clarity and carefulness of Sedley's presentation. Some are relatively minor. For example, early in the introduction, he states that Plato's use of mathematics as a paradigm of knowledge might reflect "the incipient influence of Pythagoreanism." However, he gives no indication, even in a footnote, as to who Pythagoras was or what Pythagoreanism consists in. Although he discusses Pythagoras eleven pages later in the introduction, this first mention, without so much as a forward-reference, could leave new readers in the dark. Similarly, Sedley makes mention of "Stoic ethics" in the introduction without indicating who the Stoics were, and he uses the term "a priori" as if its meaning is already clear to the reader. Likewise, in a couple places Sedley's summaries of the views and arguments seem to take for granted too much from the reader. While discussing the theory of recollection in the Meno, Sedley writes, "Thanks to its pre-existence, a soul can recollect knowledge which it once actively had; and because 'all nature is akin', one such recollection can lead on eventually to global recall." Sedley explains neither where the premise that "all nature is akin" comes from nor what precisely it means, and neither is likely to be obvious to first-time readers. Without understanding the meaning of this premise, however, the inference from it to the possibility of obtaining global knowledge is mysterious.

One more significant point of criticism is that some important topics and arguments are ignored or merely glossed over. First, there is a great deal in the Phaedo that Sedley does not discuss. He includes only a short paragraph on the Affinity Argument, barely mentions Simmias' and Cebes' dual Attunement and Cloak objections, and does not discuss (among other things) Socrates' refutation of the theory that the soul is an attunement, Socrates' autobiographical critique of causal theories, or the theory of immanent forms. Some of these Sedley draws attention to in a short paragraph titled "Other highlights" (placed at the end of the section on Phaedo), but it is nonetheless disappointing that they do not receive more attention, given the critical roles they play in the philosophical narrative of the text. Second, Sedley largely ignores or downplays important discussions of ethics and moral psychology in the texts. He does not discuss Meno's defense of the Socratic claim that everyone always desires and pursues what they believe to be good, and in the section on Phaedo he more or less ignores the account of virtue in terms of wisdom as well as the critical discussion at 81b-83e of the ways in which pleasure and pain corrupt a person's soul (and the accompanying account of the kinds of lives into which inferior souls are reincarnated). To downplay these discussions to the extent that Sedley does, given how important they are to understanding the course of Platonic thought about these topics, seems negligent. My suspicion, alluded to above, is that this unfortunate neglect is a result of the volume's emphasis on the role of these two texts as providing the foundations for Plato's metaphysical theories. Their significance for Platonic ethics and moral psychology, it seems, is simply set aside.

It is, of course, no small task to summarize two dialogues as dense and complex as these two, and inevitably certain issues will have to be highlighted at the expense of others. However, there are two ways in which Sedley might have made more advantageous use of the space available. First, he devotes roughly equal amounts of space in the introduction to both dialogues (about eleven pages for Meno and twelve for Phaedo), and given that Phaedo is nearly twice as long as Meno (and even more complex), we might question that decision. Second, Sedley includes an extended defense of his favored interpretation of the controversial passage at 74b: "Don't equal stones and sticks sometimes, despite being the same ones, appear at one time equal, at another not?" This is a rare moment of indulgence in what I have noted is a mostly agenda-free introduction. The problem with Sedley's discusssion is twofold. To begin with, it is too technical and will likely go over the heads of many or most new readers. Sedley's presentation of the alternative interpretations available is especially unclear. He writes, "Most English editors and translators have preferred the variant reading 'appear equal to one but not to another', and have been divided as to whether to construe it as 'appear … to' or 'equal to'." The two options presented at the end of that sentence do not make it at all obvious what precisely the interpretations amount to. Secondly, given the limitations of space, allotting a full page of a twelve-page summary of Phaedo to this particular textual issue seems ill-advised. Sedley claims that how we choose to interpret 74b is of huge significance to our understanding of the Recollection Argument, and that much is certainly true. However, he fails to make it clear to the reader why it is true (for example, by specifying what the alternative implications of the rejected interpretations would be). In light of all this, surely it would have been preferable to address this controversial textual issue in a footnote and to devote the additional space to one of the neglected topics mentioned above.

I turn now to the translations, which I find lucid, accessible, and readable. They maintain a rigorous and conscientious accountability to the Greek but avoid the awkwardness of strictly literal translations. Indeed, stylistically the translations are warm and engaging, and they manage to preserve something of the beauty of the original. Key Greek terms tend to be translated consistently throughout, and where context dictates a shift in the translation of an important term, footnotes alert the reader to it. In various places Long departs from most translators in ways that helpfully elucidate or emphasize a speaker's meaning. For example, at Phaedo 67d, Long renders hoi philosophountes orthôs as "those who really love wisdom," where most translators have "those who practice philosophy in the right way." Given that the argument Socrates has just offered at this point shows that only in death can one attain truth and wisdom, Long's translation better captures the reason why "those who really love wisdom" would be the ones most eager to die. (A footnote also draws attention to the Greek and notes that the same term will also be rendered "philosophers" at other points in the translation.)

Other subtle touches throughout will make the translations especially suitable for student use. In a number of places where doing so facilitates understanding of the text, Long places key words in scare quotations or italics. For example, at Meno 86d, Long translates Socrates' admonishment to Meno, "But since you aren't even trying to control yourself -- no doubt so that you may be 'free' -- but are trying to control me … " The inclusion of the quotation marks draws attention to Socrates' sarcastic disdain for Meno's brand of freedom, which in previous translations would be easier to miss.

Sedley's footnotes supplement the translation well and are informative and helpful. There are a handful of places where footnotes are conspicuously missing (for example, there is no footnote on Asclepius at Socrates' final words of the Phaedo), but on the whole they are well-placed. The footnotes usefully transliterate and explain the meanings of important Greek terms, identify historical references, and provide various kinds of guidance to the reader. For example, whenever speakers refer to something that they have said or agreed upon earlier in their conversation, a footnote indicates the precise place in the text being referred to. These prove especially valuable in the Phaedo, where a number of intra-textual allusions are spread throughout a complex conversation. The footnotes also, at critical points, offer justification for philological decisions that were made (such footnotes being, of course, less for students themselves and more for the instructors who are assigning the texts to them).

Only occasionally do the translations suffer from a cumbersome rendering or questionable word choice. Consider Phaedo 66b, for which Long offers the rather graceless translation, "You know, a sort of short cut may well be taking us with our reason towards the quarry in our inquiry." The decision to render eilikrines as "unalloyed" or andrikôs with the somewhat alienating (albeit most literal) "manfully" might also be questioned. In at least one place, the translation choice could negatively affect the reader's comprehension. At Meno 98a Long translates, "[true opinions] are not worth very much until someone ties them down by reasoning out the cause." Unless the reader is antecedently familiar with the Platonic notion of an aitia, it is likely to be unclear what on earth it means to "reason out a cause." This could be remedied either with a more accessible translation (such as Grube's "giving an account of the reason why" or Beresford's looser "figuring out what makes them true") or with a footnote. The volume does not offer the latter, however, and even when this phrase is discussed in the introduction, no explanatory remarks whatsoever are offered.

Despite a few relatively minor problems, the volume is, as I have said, excellent. While I do not think the translations are decisively superior to some of the other high-quality, available translations, such as the Grube, they are certainly at least on par with any of them. The lucid introduction and helpful footnotes, moreover, will make this volume especially suitable for the students and new readers at whom the Cambridge series is primarily aimed.