Mental Actions

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Lucy O'Brien and Matthew Soteriou (eds.), Mental Actions, Oxford UP, 2009, 286pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199225989.

Reviewed by Matthew Boyle, Harvard University



“We thought that, despite the fact that it should be at the centre of the philosophy of mind, the topic of mental action has been somewhat overlooked.” Thus write Lucy O’Brien and Matthew Soteriou in their Preface to this volume of twelve essays on mental action, its nature, scope, and philosophical significance. The second part of their point seems indisputable: although various authors have asserted that there is something importantly “active” or “agential” about, e.g., our thinking, judging, choosing, imagining, reasoning, and planning, the sense in which these phenomena are active has not to date received much theoretical attention. Indeed, the general categories in which the philosophy of mind has traded over the past several decades — state, event, process, disposition, causal relation, etc. — arguably tend to suppress this question, inasmuch as they classify mental phenomena in ways that abstract from whether they are acts or undergoings, things a subject does or things that merely happen to her.

The more intriguing and potentially controversial claim that O’Brien and Soteriou make, however, is the one they put first: that the topic of mental action should be at the center of the philosophy of mind. Not just every topic that has been overlooked deserves a fuller hearing from philosophers. If the topic of mental action should figure centrally in philosophical reflection about the mind, why is this so?

Like any volume of essays by several authors, this one presents diverse viewpoints on its central theme. Nevertheless, most of the contributors appear to agree with the editors on this basic point. The volume can thus be read as a sort of manifesto for the topic of mental action. Since it is a manifesto composed by many hands, it is no surprise that several distinct rationales should emerge. In this review, I propose to distinguish a few kinds of rationale for interest in mental action that emerge from the discussion, and to consider the various papers in the collection in relation to them.

1. Mental Action and Bodily Action

One way to get interested in mental action is to note some respects in which it differs, at least prima facie, from bodily action. For one thing, mental action seems not to be subject to the kinds of limitations to which bodily action is subject. “Nothing is more free than the imagination of man”, said Hume, and Thales is supposed to have said, “Nothing is more active than thought, for it flies over the universe.” But the sense of freedom or activity at issue here is also elusive. It is true that what I can think is not subject to the same sorts of constraints as what I can effect by moving my body, and that what I can actually achieve is limited in ways that what I can imagine is not. But similar things might be said about my nightmares: You can chain me up, but you don’t thereby limit the terrors I confront in my dreams. Nevertheless we would not say that having a nightmare is a free act, whereas we are inclined to say this about thinking and imagining. What is the difference? In what sense is my thinking a certain thought or imagining a certain scene (sometimes?) something I freely do, not just something that happens to me?

The difficulty here is not merely the familiar one that confronts us when we ask, “What is left over if I subtract the fact that my arm rises from the fact that I raise my arm?” This Wittgensteinian question is standardly used to pose the problem of how bodily actions differ from mere happenings, but in this domain there is at least a natural first response: namely, that my raising my arm requires, not merely that my arm rise, but that it do so as a conscious realization of a certain desire or intention of mine. My activity here seems — at least roughly, and on first inspection — to consist in this: that my having some sort of representation of moving in a certain way is the cause of my so moving, so that the cause of what happens in this sense lies “in me.” But if the idea of the cause lying in me applies to thinking or imagining, it seems that it must be a different sort of application. For what causes me to think such-and-such surely cannot be a representation of thinking such-and-such (or a desire to think about topic X plus the belief that thinking such-and-such would be a way of thinking about X): if I already have in mind what I aim to think, that would seem tantamount to already having had the thought in question, or at any rate would obviate the need for such a thought. And similarly, what causes me to imagine a certain scene surely can’t be a representation of the very scene in question. I might in advance of imagining have some abstract idea of what I hope to conjure up: a cat that gradually disappears until all that is left is its smile, or the wallpaper of my childhood bedroom. But in what sense is the actual imagining of something that meets one of these descriptions an act that expresses my free agency? In what sense do I guide or author it? Intuitively, it does seem that what I think or imagine is sometimes “up to me.” Yet there does not seem to be space here for the gap between setting a determinate aim and executing it that is characteristic of bodily action, and which gives us our grip on what it means for me to be the guide or author in this case.

This is a quick attempt to raise a difficulty, and some will dispute that there is one, or at any rate that there is a special one here that is absent in the bodily case.1 But these reflections at least suggest that considering the similarities and differences between mental and bodily action will provide a useful stimulus to theorizing in each domain. Several of the papers in the volume under review contribute to this consideration. One recurring theme is that standard approaches to thinking about bodily action cannot be easily adapted to accommodate mental action. Thus John Gibbons’s “Reason in Action” suggests that if phenomena such as considering the proposition that p, judging that p, and deciding to φ are actions, then an action cannot be — as one standard story about the nature of action would suggest — simply an event nondeviantly caused by a subject’s apprehension of a practical reason. For this sort of account will either include too much (since my coming to want to φ, for instance, may be nondeviantly caused by a reason, but is clearly not an action), or else, if supplemented to exclude such cases, will exclude mental actions as well. The upshot, Gibbons argues, is that being active requires not merely being moved by a reason but being moved by the fact that you see something as a reason. He proposes that this notion can be used to give an account of action that applies to both intentional bodily movement and active thought.

Whereas Gibbons holds that we can, in the end, give a uniform account of action that applies to both bodily and mental varieties, Brian O’Shaughnessy’s “Trying and Acting” argues that there is at least one species of mental action that differs from bodily action in a fundamental respect. According to O’Shaughnessy, when we assert ‘A did x’, where x is a bodily action, we imply that there was an event which was “the active generation of x,” an act of willing or trying which is not identical to, but rather the cause of, A’s x-ing. Something similar holds for certain sorts of mental action: if I try to remember a name, and succeed, then my remembering the name is presumably an event caused by my trying to remember. But, O’Shaughnessy maintains, there are also kinds of mental action to which this analysis does not apply. If I voluntarily talk (inwardly) to myself or imagine raising my arm, there is no distinction between my act of willing and an event my willing produces. Rather, in such cases, the willing just is the acting. So, O’Shaughnessy concludes, not all willings are tryings-to-produce; we must leave room for a form of willing which is internally, non-productively active.

O’Shaughnessy’s discussion suggests that a consideration of mental action should lead us to distinguish two fundamentally different forms of being active, one of which has a productive structure, while the other is not ordered toward producing some result. Interestingly, two other papers in the collection arrive at similar conclusions, albeit from quite different angles. Pamela Hieronymi’s “Two Kinds of Agency” argues that if we assume that certain attitudes held by a subject “embody her answer to some question” (for instance, that my belief that p embodies my answer to the question whether p, and that my intention to φ embodies my answer to the question whether to φ — claims that Hieronymi has defended in other work), then we should also recognize two distinct kinds of agency that a subject can exercise with respect to her own attitudes. On the one hand, she can sometimes exercise managerial control over them by intentionally taking means to influence them in ways that serve her purposes, much as she can intentionally influence objects in her environment in ways that serve her purposes. But, Hieronymi argues, a subject also exercises a different and more fundamental sort of control over her attitudes in virtue of being able to reconsider her answer to the questions to which they embody answers. This evaluative control differs in important respects from other forms of agency: it does not involve the ability to alter one’s attitudes in whatever way one wills, and it is not exercised from a reflective, distanced standpoint, with the aim of producing a certain effect on the attitude in question. Nevertheless, Hieronymi argues, evaluative control should count as a form of agency; it is simply a different form from the managerial variety, which we find more familiar because of its prominence in the bodily case.

Thomas Crowther’s “Perceptual Activity and the Will” also argues for the existence of a form of mental agency whose structure is not productive/manipulative. The case he considers is quite different from O’Shaughnessy’s or Hieronymi’s: not active imagining or attitude-formation but the kind of active perceptual attending involved in listening to something or watching something. Crowther argues persuasively that listening to O is not analyzable in instrumental terms, as a matter of performing a task whose goal is hearing O. Listening to O — in contrast to listening out for O — is not an activity that terminates with hearing O, for if one is listening to a songbird, for instance, one does not merely aim to have heard it at some moment, but to hear whatever sounds it makes over some period of time. Crowther concludes that the relation between listening-to and hearing is not productive; rather, listening to O is a matter of actively maintaining or sustaining aural contact with O, an activity of keeping oneself in a position to hear, not of bringing hearing about.

I found this to be an especially thought-provoking trio of papers. What they suggest, to me at least, is that what we first and foremost need is not a theory of action that applies to mental as well as bodily cases, but rather a more searching investigation of what different forms of “being active” are possible, and of the logical or metaphysical distinctions among them. A tempting first reaction to the observation that certain mental phenomena seem active is to suppose that we must either fit these phenomena into the sort of theory of active production that fits the case of intentional bodily movement, or else deny that these are genuine cases of acting after all. These papers suggest that the deeper lesson of a consideration of “mental action” may be not so much that standard theories of action need refinement, as that the kind of activity on which such theories focus is only one species of a wider genus, whose other species call for different (though no doubt related) sorts of theory.

2. Mental Action, Freedom, and Responsibility

A different way to become interested in mental action is via a thought about the conditions of our possessing the sort of freedom that makes us responsible for what we do. A familiar line of thought, which figures in standard arguments for agent-causal or volitionalist views in action theory and for libertarian views about free will, begins by provoking in us the intuition that a person’s actions are free only if her choice to perform them is free, and then urges us to conclude that our real focus in discussions about freedom and responsibility should be on the freedom of the subject’s mental act of choosing to do A. Yet if choosing to do A is an act distinct from doing A, difficult questions arise about what the freedom of this mental act could amount to. For what is required for my choice itself to be free? Must I choose to choose as I do? If so, the familiar line of thought seems to reapply, and we are on the way to an explanatory regress. But if not, then it is not obvious what my freedom in choosing can involve.

David Owens’s “Freedom and Practical Judgment” takes up this challenge, arguing that our capacity to choose — which he identifies with our capacity to make “practical judgments” about what to do — can be free in the very same sense in which our actions are free. Owens argues that this does not lead to a regress, or at least not to a vicious one, because the sense of freedom at issue is simply: being under the control of practical judgment, and practical judgments themselves are under the control of practical judgment. Although we cannot form practical judgments about what to do at will, Owens suggests that we can control our practical judgment in just the way in which we can control what we intend and how we act: by reflecting on the merits of our options and the constraints on our deliberation — and making a practical judgment. The capacity for practical judgment is thus a capacity that can control itself, and for this reason can be the source of our practical freedom.

Thomas Pink’s “Reason, Voluntariness, and Moral Responsibility” also accepts that freedom of decision is a precondition of responsible freedom in action, and that our decisions are not themselves things we can form at will. What I decide is not determined by any act of willing to decide, but rather by some reason which persuades me that a certain act is worth performing. Yet, Pink argues, what makes me morally responsible for how I act cannot be merely that my decisions are the product of my capacity to be influenced by reasons. Pink calls the view that we are morally responsible simply in virtue of having exercised our rationality “ethical rationalism” and he argues that this position draws the boundaries of moral responsibility too widely, making it appear that we may be responsible for our beliefs, desires, and emotions, whereas we are plainly not responsible for such attitudes in the sense in which we are responsible for our actions. We can however avoid ethical rationalism, without lapsing into the view that I can decide at will, by characterizing the specific form of goal-directed activity involved in decision. A decision, Pink argues, is itself a goal-directed action, one that it is rational to perform only if its being taken is sufficiently likely to lead to the attainment of its object, one whose actual performance thus expresses a subject’s power of rational self-determination. Hence it can be the ground of our responsibility for how we act.

These are both subtle and interesting papers, which take us through familiar terrain but make us see new things. One thing I wondered about was the appeal, in both papers, to notions of capacity or power. These notions are of course closely linked to a certain notion of an act — namely, an event or state whose primary explanation lies in the presence of the capacity or power in the subject in question, and which thus counts as that subject’s self-actualization. Our understanding of these notions, and of the specific forms they take in their “rational” case, seem on the face of it to be wound together with our understanding of contrasts between active and passive, self-determined and other-determined, in such a way that an account which appeals to them leaves a significant part of the problem of agency and responsibility still to be addressed. This is not to criticize the frameworks for thinking about free agency that Owens and Pink propose: each seems promising. But it is to suggest that more work remains to be done.

3. Mental Action and Self-Knowledge

A final way to come at the topic of mental action is via its connection with our capacity for self-knowledge — our ability to know certain sorts of facts about our own minds in an immediate and authoritative way, without self-observation and indeed without obvious grounds of any sort. The connection here might be made in either of two (not necessarily exclusive) directions. On the one hand, it might be argued that the fact that we are active or self-determining in certain aspects of our mental lives helps to explain our capacity to know our own minds. On the other hand, it might be suggested that the fact that we know aspects of our own mental life in an immediate and first-personal way helps to explain our capacity for a distinctive sort of mental action or self-determination. The former idea has been given an influential development in recent work by Richard Moran. The latter has been a recurrent theme in recent and not-so-recent work by Tyler Burge, Christine Korsgaard, John McDowell, and Sydney Shoemaker, among others. It is a little surprising, then, that although there are several papers in the present volume on the connection between mental action and self-knowledge, none of these authors receives much mention in them. The papers in this area struck me as less interconnected than those in the two domains previously discussed, and the reason seemed to be that there was less consensus among these authors about what needs to be understood and why.

Christopher Peacocke’s “Mental Action and Self-Awareness (II): Epistemology” continues the project begun in his “Mental Action and Self-Awareness (I)” (2007). The earlier paper developed a conception of mental action on which the activity involved in it is to be explained along the same general lines as that involved in bodily action. The present paper adds an account of the epistemology of mental action, so understood. A central thought here is that we come to know our own mental actions “by taking an apparent action awareness at face value,” and that this awareness amounts to knowledge because our having a disposition to so take it belongs to the possession-conditions of the relevant mental concepts (p. 193). Having developed this idea, Peacocke goes on to argue that his view is not subject to the sorts of objections that apply to “perceptual models” of self-knowledge, and to consider how his account addresses questions about the compatibility of privileged self-knowledge with content externalism.

Lucy O’Brien’s “Mental Actions and the No-Content Problem” argues that there is at least one form of externalism whose tenability is called into question by a consideration of mental action. Some authors (notably Gareth Evans and John McDowell) have maintained that certain thought-contents are “object-dependent,” so that an apparent act of thinking expressible with the words “That glass is heavy,” for instance, might under certain circumstances fail to express any thought whatsoever, due to the fact that the purported content that glass fails to stand in the right relation to an object. O’Brien suggests that this sort of externalism faces a problem in explaining what a person who essays such a failed thought (e.g., by attempting to entertain the supposition That glass is heavy) was even trying to do; if the purported content that glass is not available, then there seems to be no suitable notion with which to express the content of her attempt. She concludes that such externalism cannot give a satisfying account of what is going on in the consciousness of a person who is subject to this sort of content failure.

Matthew Soteriou’s “Mental Agency, Conscious Thinking, and Phenomenal Character” proposes an intriguing but quite dense and complicated account of what is involved in a subject’s knowing what he is thinking or judging. The general idea is that, if awareness of judging is awareness of something one is doing, and if something one is doing must be an event unfolding over time, rather than a mere state or an already-completed result, then there is a difficulty about what awareness of judging can be an awareness of. For P. T. Geach has argued — convincingly, in Soteriou’s view — that mental acts like judging lack temporal extension; hence, it seems, they cannot supply the right sort of object for an awareness-of-what-I-am-doing. Soteriou’s solution is to posit that there is a “phenomenally conscious mental act that unfolds over time” (perhaps my saying something in “inner speech”) which is the “vehicle” of my consciously judging that p, something my consciousness of which “manifests” my consciousness of my judging. This proposal gives rise to various natural objections, several of which Soteriou confronts. But though Soteriou’s responses are interesting, my own feeling was that if this must be the solution, it might be better to reject one of the premises that led to the problem. I would be for rejecting the assumption that all awareness of being active must involve awareness of an unfolding event, an assumption which I think is grounded mainly in an unwarranted tendency to make intentional bodily movement the model for all mental activity (see §1 above).

Soteriou’s paper is one of three that give intensive scrutiny to the phenomenon of consciously judging or consciously thinking. Fabian Dorsch’s “Judging and the Scope of Mental Agency” argues that there is something importantly right in the thought that we cannot judge “at will.” Dorsch is dissatisfied, however, with standard accounts of where the obstacle to judging at will lies — approaches which appeal to the idea that judgment is normatively linked to, or “aimed at,” truth. He argues that we can give a better account of the obstacle by appealing to certain necessary “phenomenal” concomitants of judging and intentionally doing: we experience our judgments as motivated by epistemic reasons, and our intentional actions as motivated by practical reasons, and these two modes of experience are incompatible. Joëlle Proust’s “Is There a Sense of Agency for Thought?”, by contrast, argues that our sense of agency in thinking has a basis in our ability to predict how our thinking will unfold. She hypothesizes the existence of a set of “comparators” that allow a subject to anticipate the course of mental actions and to compare these anticipations with feedback on the relevant processes. Proust argues that positing such processes, and our “phenomenological access” to them, would help to explain both familiar experiences of agency over thought and puzzling abnormal cases, as when schizophrenics claim to experience “thought insertion.”

This is not the place to engage in detail with these ideas and arguments. I noted at the start of this section that these papers, interesting as they are, are generally inattentive to a significant body of recent work on the relation between mental agency and self-knowledge. Much of this work has been done in a broadly Kantian tradition, a tradition that sees a close connection between our capacity for self-consciousness and the kind of capacity for distinctively rational self-determination paradigmatically expressed in judgment and choice. The fact that this tradition receives no real consideration in this volume seems to me a significant lacuna, and one that accounts for a certain unmotivatedness in some of the discussion here.


Turning now to assess the collection as a whole, I would say that it certainly succeeds in demonstrating the interest of the topic of mental action, and in opening a large number of fruitful lines of inquiry. One complaint I had about the volume is that, as presented, it is hard to survey. The order of the papers reflects their thematic connections, but the editors have not actually imposed any topical divisions on the contents, with the result that it is hard to guess which papers will be related until you have read them through. Soteriou gives a meticulous overview in his Introduction, and I have tried to give another here, but the volume would have benefited from a topical division, and it would have benefited even more from an effort at an early point to define some themes and solicit papers that take opposing positions, or investigate related questions, or respond to some important view.

I was also struck by the fact that the history of philosophy played hardly any role in framing the discussion. It is not merely that there are no essays on historical figures; the striking thing is that classic positions on these topics do not even figure as reference points for most of the contributors (Pink is an exception here). I have mentioned the neglect, in the discussion of mental action and self-knowledge, of any reference to the Kantian tradition of thinking about these topics. Another figure who ought to receive some acknowledgment, I think, is Aristotle: the idea that there is more than one way of being active, and that various kinds of mental activity do not take the form of a producing something (poiêsis) or a processive change toward some result (kinêsis), is an idea with deep Aristotelian roots, and one that deserves more attention. Others would undoubtedly make a case for the relevance of other figures, but at any rate, the presence of some landmarks of this kind would help to give the reader a sense of what positions are possible and why the choice among them matters.

These criticisms should not, however, be taken to diminish the importance of the project undertaken here, or the value of the contributions these essays make to our understanding of the different species of mental action and their rightful place in the philosophy of mind. This is a volume that genuinely breaks new ground, and one that will be of broad interest to philosophers of mind, action theorists, and moral psychologists.2


Mele, Alfred R. 1997. “Agency and Mental Action.” Philosophical Perspectives, 11: Mind, Causation, and World, pp. 231-249.

Müller, Anselm. 1992. “Mental Teleology.” Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S., 92, pp. 161-183.

Peacocke, Christopher. “Mental Action and Self-Awareness (I).” In J. Cohen and B. McLaughlin, eds., Contemporary Debates in the Philosophy of Mind. Oxford: Blackwell.

Strawson, Galen. 2003. "Mental Ballistics or the Involutariness of Spontaneity." Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, N.S., 103, pp. 227-256.

1 That there is a special difficulty here is disputed, for instance, by Alfred Mele in his “Agency and Mental Action” (1997), on which his contribution to the present volume builds (cp. also Peacocke 2007). Mele argues that insofar as there is mental action, it consists of mental events occurring as a result of some pertinent mental cause, just as intentional bodily action consists of bodily events occurring as a result of some pertinent mental cause. Authors who argue that there is a distinctive difficulty about certain kinds of mental action include Müller 1992 and Strawson 2003. The difficulty leads Strawson to conclude that phenomena such as thinking, imagining, and judging are not actions in any ordinary sense of the term, whereas Müller concludes that the difficulty should rather make us question whether all purposive action is structurally akin to intentional bodily movement.

2 Thanks to Rachel Cohen and Doug Lavin for comments on an earlier draft.