Mental Causation: A Counterfactual Theory

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Thomas Kroedel, Mental Causation: A Counterfactual Theory, Cambridge University Press, 2020, 224pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108487146.

Reviewed by Umut Baysan, University of Oxford


In this relatively short book, Thomas Kroedel has two central goals: (i) to propose and defend a theory of causation; (ii) to show how mental causation is possible. Regarding (i), as the title suggests, we are given a counterfactual theory of causation, supported with auxiliary theories concerning metaphysics of events and semantics of counterfactual conditionals. As to (ii), by "mental causation", Kroedel really means "causation of physical effects by mental causes" (p. 1), so he is not interested in cases where mental events cause other mental events. Focusing on the mental-to-physical cases, Kroedel explores what various views in contemporary metaphysics of mind imply about the possibility of mental causation.

Mental causation -- in particular causation of physical effects by mental causes -- is often taken to be problematic, or even mysterious, especially if one takes the putative mental causes to be non-physical entities of some sort. Suppose I see a slice of chocolate cake on the table, and then form the desire to eat it. Subsequently my hand moves towards the cake, and the cake ends up in my mouth. It seems plausible that my desire to eat cake has something to do with my hand movement and the subsequent trajectory of the slice of cake. More specifically, seemingly my desire -- which is a mental event, or an instantiation of a mental property -- plays a causal role in bringing about my hand movement -- which is a physical event. If what seems to be true in this example is in fact true, we have an example of mental causation. Then, what is the problem? Where is the mystery?

According to a traditional way of construing these debates in metaphysics of mind, it is not clear at all how seemingly non-physical events or properties could causally influence physical goings-on, such as bodily movements. Plausibly, my hand movement towards the cake can in principle be given a completely physical causal explanation (which appeals to muscular contractions, neural firings and whatnot), hence there doesn't seem to be any causal role left for putatively non-physical events or properties, such as desires. It thus seems that mental causation is problematic particularly for those views that take mental events or properties to be non-physical events or properties.

Two views in metaphysics of mind that Kroedel focuses on are non-reductive physicalism and (non-physicalist) property dualism. While the former is the variety of physicalism according to which mental properties are not identical with physical properties, property dualism rejects physicalism as well as the identity of the mental and the physical. So, despite their differences, these two views agree that mental events or properties are not identifiable with physical events or properties. Thus, it is commonly thought that these two views face the problem of mental causation. Kroedel's view is that both these views can accommodate mental causation, insofar as they adopt his counterfactual theory of causation. Like many before him, he thinks that reductive physicalism -- the variety of physicalism which identifies the mental with the physical -- can accommodate mental causation too, which then means that mental causation is possible for virtually all relevant views regarding the mind-body problem. From this, Kroedel concludes that "Questions about the nature of mind will ultimately have to be decided on different grounds" (p. 203).

Kroedel's specific version of the counterfactual theory of causation (in conjunction with his preferred theory of events and various proposals about how to read counterfactual conditionals) is too sophisticated to spell out in a short review. But here is a crudely simplified summary. First, the relata of causal relations are events. Here, events are understood in a Kimean way: an event is an object's having a property at a time. On Kroedel's preferred interpretation, constituents of events (viz., objects, properties, and times) are essential to, and determine, the identity of events. Second, counterfactual dependence is sufficient for causation. That is, if an event e counterfactually depends on a previous event c, then c is a cause of e. This means that cases of causation where there is no counterfactual dependence are not counterexamples to Kroedel's theory -- while, of course, cases of counterfactual dependence (of the right kind) without causation would be counterexamples. Third, counterfactual dependence is cashed out in a Lewisian framework. Say c happens, and then e happens. We want to say that e counterfactually depends on c just in case if c hadn't occurred, then e wouldn't have occurred. This is to say that both c and e occur (in this temporal order), and all the closest possible worlds in which c doesn't occur are also worlds in which e doesn't occur. This relatively simplified version of the theory runs into various troubles, and Kroedel carefully refines each step to solve each problem. The interested reader will find his discussion of these problems and solutions throughout the second half of Chapter 1 rewarding.

Kroedel's presentation of his counterfactual theory of causation involves an interesting discussion of double prevention. As far as I can tell, this discussion also constitutes the only direct argument against alternative theories of causation that are invoked in the mental causation debate. Double prevention cases are cases in which an event e1 prevents another event e2 from preventing yet another event e3 from happening. For example, suppose that Ted set out to harm Zed, but Ned is holding Ted tightly, hence preventing him from harming Zed. I find out about this and free Ted, who goes on to kick Zed. My freeing Ted from Ned is an instance of double prevention, as by doing so, I prevent Ned from preventing Ted from harming Zed. Does my freeing Ted cause Zed harm? Kroedel argues that at least some cases of double prevention are cases of causation (i.e., e1 can cause e3 by preventing e2 from preventing e3 from happening), yet according to alternative theories of causation (e.g., transference theories and powers theories) they cannot be, which is bad news for such theories. There is a lot to say on these matters, and the interested reader will find a fine discussion of them throughout the book.

Having proposed his theory of causation, Kroedel moves on to exploring what this theory predicts about mental causation in Chapter 2. As stated above, he focuses on non-reductive physicalism and property dualism, which he calls "naturalistic dualism". Kroedel formulates the former view as a strong supervenience thesis with a failure of identity: no mental property is identical with any single physical property; mental properties strongly supervene on physical properties; and the modal strength of this strong supervenience is metaphysical. Naturalistic dualism is structurally very similar to non-reductive physicalism formulated as such, the only difference being the modal strength of the strong supervenience relation that relates mental properties to physical properties. While non-reductive physicalism holds that the mental metaphysically strongly supervenes on the physical, naturalistic dualism holds that the mental nomologically (and not metaphysically) strongly supervenes on the physical. So, while for non-reductive physicalists, a given supervenience base property metaphysically necessitates the supervening mental property, for the dualist, it only nomologically necessitates the supervening mental property. This is a fairly standard way of distinguishing between these views (with which I am in broad agreement), though some discussion of why some philosophers have been critical of this distinction, and what Kroedel may have to say in response to these philosophers, would have been nice.

A peculiar version of naturalistic dualism that Kroedel formulates is what he calls "super-nomological dualism". Being a version of naturalistic dualism, super-nomological dualism is committed to the nomological (but not metaphysical) strong supervenience of the mental on the physical. But, in addition, it maintains that the strong supervenience relation holds because of psychophysical laws which are stronger than ordinary laws of nature. That is, on this view, "the relation between the mental and the physical is a matter of law, but that the relevant laws are 'more necessary' than ordinary laws of nature" (p. 88). Thus defined, super-nomological dualism is important for Kroedel, as it turns out to be the version of naturalistic dualism that can accommodate mental causation.

According to non-reductive physicalism and naturalistic dualism, how can mental events cause physical events? For Kroedel, in both cases, the strong supervenience of the mental on the physical plays a very important role. It turns out that mental events can cause other events because mental properties strongly supervene on physical properties. As explained above, in the case of non-reductive physicalism, this strong supervenience holds with metaphysical strength. Kroedel argues that, for the non-reductive physicalist, to have a mental property is to have one physical property or other which is a supervenience base of that mental property, and these base properties are causally relevant. But why is that? Recall that counterfactual dependence is sufficient for causation (or so argues Kroedel). There are physical events which counterfactually depend on the physical events which have these base properties as their constituents. Recall my desire to eat cake. This desire is necessarily accompanied by some physical realizer of it, and each possible physical-realizer event is capable of causing the relevant bodily movements.

One might ask: On this view, do mental events cause other events in virtue of being mental events? In other words, are they causes qua mental events? It appears that Kroedel's non-reductive physicalist is giving mental events causal efficacy because of the supervenience of the mental on the physical. He dismisses this as a problem, arguing that these mental events are essentially mental events. Thus, if they are causes, they are causes qua mental events. The argument here goes as follows. Kroedel understands events in the aforementioned Kimean fashion, so events have their properties essentially. With the non-reductionist assumption that mental properties are not identical to physical properties, these events are essentially mental events, not physical events (p. 67). I myself have never been moved by the so-called qua worry about mental causation, but it remains to be seen whether those who are moved by it will find Kroedel's reply persuasive.

In the case of naturalistic dualism, things are a little complicated because the strong supervenience relation doesn't hold with metaphysical necessity. But recall that the super-nomological dualist holds that the relevant laws are modally stronger than ordinary contingent laws, which makes the supervenience relation strong enough to obtain similar results. That is, although it is not metaphysically necessary that mental properties are instantiated alongside their causally relevant realizers, the nearest possible world in which a mental property is instantiated without a causally relevant physical realizer is more distant than those possible worlds that are relevant to counterfactual conditionals that underwrite claims of mental causation. Now here, one worry is whether super-nomological dualism is a view which is designed merely to accommodate mental causation. Suffice it to say that super-nomological dualism is a view which makes sense only if the modal strength of a law can be understood gradually. Kroedel rightly notes that this is not tenable under some views about laws (p. 88, fn. 32). To be clear, he isn't defending super-nomological dualism. He is merely showing how those who hold this view can accommodate mental causation. Still, the reader is left wondering: is there any non-ad hoc reason to be a super-nomological dualist?

For super-nomological dualism to be plausible, there has to be some reason for some philosophers of mind to defend it. The only reason we are given seems to be this: if causation is what Kroedel thinks it is, and if physicalism is false, then mental causation is possible only if super-nomological dualism is true. So, the non-physicalist dualist really has to worry about mental causation in order to buy into super-nomological dualism. The reasoning here requires the assumption that epiphenomenalism (i.e., the view that denies many or all putative cases of mental causation) is false. This is a book about mental causation; Kroedel's aim is to show how mental causation is possible. It is therefore understandable that epiphenomenalism is ruled out. But, as a reader who is interested in epiphenomenalism, I would have liked to see a word or two on what is so wrong with epiphenomenalism (other than the oft-cited opening remarks by Fodor), and why the non-physicalist can't (or shouldn't) be an epiphenomenalist.

As we make our way to Chapter 4, we find a very detailed discussion of what has come to be known as the "causal exclusion" problem. Those who are invested in this debate are strongly advised to consider Kroedel's arguments for various positions regarding the exclusion problem. Having argued that (i) there is mental causation (for both non-reductive physicalism and super-nomological dualism), partially by showing that (ii) there is causation by supervenience bases, now the question is whether (i) and (ii) are in tension. Do mental events and their supervenience base events causally overdetermine their effects? If so, is this a problematic kind of causal overdetermination?

What is novel in Kroedel's treatment of these questions is that answering them doesn't require you to choose a theory of the mind-body relations. Technical subtleties aside, both physicalists and dualists can give pretty much the same answers to these questions. So, here he departs from the commonly held view that while physicalists can solve the exclusion problem, dualists cannot. Appealing to the semantics of counterfactuals defended earlier in the book, Kroedel argues that the exclusion principle is false. This is the principle which says that no effect has more than one cause at a given time, unless it is causally overdetermined. Analyzing claims of causal overdetermination in terms counterfactual conditionals, Kroedel carefully shows how the exclusion principle turns out to be false on the metaphysical assumptions that non-reductive physicalism and super-nomological dualism make. Moreover, for those who don't buy his argument against the exclusion principle, he offers a separate argument against the claim that mental causes and physical causes don't causally overdetermine their effects. He shows that the kind of causal overdetermination that the non-reductive physicalist and the super-nomological dualist would get in cases of mental causation is different from the kind of causal overdetermination that is deemed problematic in the literature (e.g., systematized versions of fire squad cases). So, somewhat ironically, Kroedel's solution is actually overdetermined -- which is OK; overdetermination needn't be a bad thing!

One thing that seems to be missing in Kroedel's treatment of the exclusion problem is the discussion of whether the exclusion problem should be a problem for non-physicalist views to begin with. Two (of the five) claims that fuel the exclusion problem are: (i) the causal completeness of the physical and (ii) the denial of epiphenomenalism. The latter is simply the claim that some mental events are causes of physical events. Suffice it to say that some property dualists are very much open to the possibility of epiphenomenalism, which relates to my earlier point above that a more detailed discussion of epiphenomenalism would have been desirable. The former, on the other hand, is the principle that every physical event that has a cause has a sufficient physical cause. (Kroedel carefully considers different versions of this principle, putting it in different versions of the exclusion problem.) However, it needs to be said that the denial of this principle has been a resort for some property dualists, for example those who subscribe to a strong form of emergentism. This reader would have been more content had this option been considered. Despite this, it goes without saying that this book, particularly the discussion in Chapter 4, is an important contribution to the literature on the exclusion problem.

In conclusion, I have to confess that I have found the book difficult at times. Kroedel's presentation of his views and arguments gets very technical at various points. Possibly due to my own limitations, I struggled throughout Chapter 3 in particular. Having said that, Kroedel is a very efficient user of signposting, and he offers helpful recaps throughout the book. And the very helpful final chapter makes the effort worthwhile. I recommend it to advanced graduate students and colleagues working on mental causation.


Thanks to Katherine Baysan, Neil McDonnell, Nathan Wildman, and members of the editorial board for Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews for helpful comments on a previous draft.


An Open Access version of the book is published at