Mental Causation and Ontology

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Sophie Gibb, E. J. Lowe, and R. D. Ingthorsson (eds.), Mental Causation and Ontology, Oxford University Press, 2013, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199603770.

Reviewed by Sara Bernstein, Duke University


If each of your actions is caused by your neurons, then how is it that your mental states, such as beliefs and desires, are causes of your actions at all? This question constitutes the familiar problem of mental causation: if every mentally caused action has an underlying neural realizer, then it appears that the mental qua mental has no causal work left to do. This problem is closely related to the famous exclusion argument, which holds that events cannot be systematically overdetermined by mental and physical properties. Given causal closure of the physical, the mental is causally inert.

The view that faces the above two problems most acutely, nonreductive physicalism, has had a longstanding and popular reign. Nonreductive physicalism occupies a middle ground between substance dualism, according to which the mental and physical are distinct substances, and reductive physicalism, according to which the mental just is the physical. Nonreductive physicalists are committed to three major claims: (i) distinctness of mental and physical properties, (ii) causal closure of the physical, and (iii) the efficacy of the mental qua mental. Nonreductive physicalists face several extant challenges, such as providing a metaphysically satisfying picture of the relationship between the mental and the physical, vindicating the efficacy of the mental while remaining true to physicalism, and avoiding systematic causal overdetermination.

In recent years, the problem of mental causation has been treated with increasing metaphysical sophistication, involving special attention to properties, levels of being, substances, realization, constitution, supervenience, identity, and the causal relation. This book is a welcome contribution to the method of approaching mental causation as a family of related metaphysical problems. I will summarize each contribution, saving my critical and methodological remarks until the end.

The volume opens with editor S.C. Gibb's thoughtful introduction to the topic, which makes a persuasive case for treating the problem of mental causation as a family of related metaphysical puzzles. She divides the problems into three main categories: the nature of the causal relata, the nature of mental properties and substances, and the nature of the causal relation.

John Heil's paper advances a pessimistic stance about the prospects of reconciling mental causation with nonreductive physicalism. He holds that a correct conception of properties -- one according to which there is not a property assigned to each predicate -- gives the result that the mental/physical distinction is not ontologically deep.

Sydney Shoemaker's paper issues corrections to the "subset realization" account given in his Physical Realization. That account holds that properties of macroscopic objects are realized in "MSE properties", or microphysical-states-of-affairs-embedding properties. Roughly, this means that there are basic microphysical properties whose realization grounds the instantiation of all other properties. All properties that are not themselves MSE properties are realized by MSE properties. Properties are individuated by their causal profiles. The key thesis of Shoemaker's view vis à vis mental causation is that the relationship between the mental and the physical is a subset relation, under which the causal powers of a realized property are always a subset of the causal powers of the realizer. The subset of causal powers do the causal work of the mental, and hence there is no systematic overdetermination.

Peter Menzies argues for two related claims: (i) that physicalism of any sort faces challenges as serious as Cartesian dualism, and (ii) there is a better formulation of the exclusion principle around which much of the dialectic is based. Menzies argues for the following exclusion principle:

If a mental state M is realized by a distinct physical state P that is causally sufficient for behavior B, then M does not cause B.

Menzies holds that this formulation affects reductive as well as nonreductive physicalists, for causal powers of any physical property realized by finer-grained realizer states will preempt the higher-level physical states that are putatively causal. The general idea is that any "non-fundamental" state has more specific realizers that are the source of the causal power in question.[1]

Paul Noordhof argues that two leading dialectical moves -- mental causation as causal covariation and token property identity -- are overreactions to the exclusion problem, but that the good parts of these responses can be captured in his new proposal. That proposal holds that C is a cause of E if: (i) part of the minimal necessitation-base for the instance of C causes part of the minimal necessitation-base for the instance of E (the particularity condition); and (ii) part of each minimal necessitation-base of C is such that all its instantiations would cause E (the generality condition). Mental causation is causation by "broadly physical" rather than "narrowly physical" properties, and so the mental, in Noordhof's view, is not threatened by exclusion.

David Papineau defends the surprising thesis that causation fundamentally occurs at the macroscopic level. There is strong reason to doubt that causation is a basic dynamic process that occurs at the fundamental level of reality, he argues, so causation should not be considered fundamental. Papineau recognizes and discusses the compatibility of this idea with the popular "proportionality" strategy, which holds that C is a cause of E only if C has the right level of detail. Nonetheless, he denies that the nonfundamentality of mental causation protects nonreductive physicalism, since even macroscopic causes must be physical. He concludes that the view reinforces causal closure of the physical.

Three papers in the volume advance powers-based ontologies in lieu of nonreductive physicalism. E. J. Lowe presents a theory of substance causation based in powers, and argues that human will is a "spontaneous" power that can be exercised rationally. According to Lowe, individual substances are concrete bearers of properties and powers. Lowe distinguishes powers along two axes of difference: active versus passive, and causal versus non-causal. The human will is an active, non-causal power, which grants both freedom and efficacy.

Jonathan Jacobs and Timothy O'Connor explore a neo-Aristotelian metaphysics of powers based on substances rather than events, and hold that this powers-based theory yields an alternative account of metaphysical freedom. Jacobs and O'Connor's view differs from Lowe's insofar as the former holds that a substance's having a property is its having a causal power of a certain sort. All and only substances are causes of effects. Agents are causes of actions in virtue of being a particular and specially-propertied substance.

Gibb uses a powers-based ontology to suggest that mental causation is double prevention. Roughly, there is a case of double prevention when an event that would prevent an effect from occurring is itself prevented. For example, suppose that Suzy and Billy are fighter pilots assigned to bomb a city. En route to the city, Enemy Pilot follows Suzy with the intent of shooting her down, but Billy shoots down Enemy, thus preventing Enemy from preventing Suzy from bombing the city. Gibb points out that a powers theory of causation does not take double-preventers to be causes, but rather, holds that double-preventers permit the salient event to happen. Similarly, she holds, mental events permit physical outcomes to occur.

David Robb also bucks the nonreductive physicalist trend by defending type-identity theory. Type-identity theory, which holds that mental types are identical with physical types, went out of favor when multiple realizability became widely accepted. According to multiple realizability about the mental, things can be in a particular mental state (for example, being in pain) without being in the brain state associated with it (for example, C-fibers firing.) For instance, it is possible that aliens feel pain but do not share the same neuron configurations as humans. Using trope theory, the idea that the world fundamentally consists in particular property instances, Robb argues that multiple realizability is only a problem for type-identity theory if properties are universals rather than tropes.

Peter Simons distinguishes "occurrent" and "continuant" forms of causation. Occurrent causation is fundamental, and continuant causation is derivative. Mental causation is continuant causation and also provides the basis for free action.

Steinvör Árnadóttir and Tim Crane hold a meta-ontological stance about the exclusion problem. They argue that defending nonreductive physicalism against the exclusion problem doesn't require refining the ontology of the mental or the causal relata. They maintain that an answer to the exclusion problem can be ontology-neutral as long as mental causes are dependent on physical ones. This dependence, they hold, defuses the thread of widespread coincidental overdetermination.

I now turn to some general remarks. First, it is worth noting that a positive direction for the mental causation debate is the use of fundamentality to clarify ontological and causal autonomy of mental properties, and also to make sense of the idea that the mental is somehow "less" causal than the physical. Roughly, x is more fundamental than y if x is more metaphysically basic than y. Often, theses about fundamentality are conjoined with distinctions between the fundamental and the derivative, such that everything that isn't fundamental is derivative. Simons' and Menzies' contributions use this tool lightly and to good effect, and one wonders what would happen if the tremendous amount of work on fundamentality were brought to bear on the mental causation debate. Recent work by Elizabeth Barnes[2] and Jeff Watson[3] has already begun to establish such a direction in the literature.

Taken together, many of the contributions give rise to the question: what would a satisfactory nonreductive physicalist solution to the problem of mental causation look like? And who would be satisfied by such a solution? In following the mental causation literature of the past decade, I have seen two camps emerge. First, there are those who are satisfied, in principle or in practice, by strategies that massage the causal relation or relata in order to defend mental causation. Those in this camp see nonreductive physicalism as salveagable with a suitably sophisticated metaphysics of causal relata or relations. Then there are those who are skeptical that the nonreductive physicalist can give any solution to the problem of mental causation that is compatible with the view's central commitments.

I count myself among the skeptics. Though I do not share Heil's aversion to predicates as properties, I do share his pessimism about reconciling nonreductive physicalism with truly satisfying mental causation. Strategies such as Shoemaker's (this volume) that posit mental properties that are numerically distinct but not causally distinct from physical properties don't vindicate the efficacy of the mental qua mental.[4] Views that posit mental properties causally distinct from physical properties are troublingly dualistic. And views that hold that the mental and the physical are causally distinct but do not systematically overdetermine mental properties just push the metaphysical bump further under the rug: if the causal power of the mental is fully independent from that of the physical, it is causally redundant, and if it not fully independent, the efficacy of the mental qua mental hasn't been established in the first place.[5] As it seems unlikely that naturalistically inclined philosophers will be friendly to dualism, the only option for skeptics is to beat a retreat into reductionism. For this reason, I expect a resurgence of reductive physicalism and type identity of the sort that Robb (this volume) defends.

Three of the papers (those by Lowe, Jacobs and O'Connor, and Gibb) approach mental causation via powers-based ontologies. Such an approach has gained traction in recent years, with a flurry of philosophical activity applying powers-based theories to numerous metaphysical problems.[6] This approach has many virtues. First, it challenges the standing Humean dogma, which some blame for the stalling of various metaphysical debates.[7] Second, the powers-based approach appears to be adaptable to either dualistic or physicalistically friendly approaches. Third, it appears to be particularly well-suited to accounting for free action in addition to mental causation.

I am optimistic about the potential of the powers-based approach, but I see its major barrier to success to be bridging the gap between itself and other systems, or at least, clearly situating itself with respect to the dominant dialectic. Many advocates of more traditional approaches see the powers-based system as operating within its own philosophical universe and making little contact with the existing framework. This hurts both sides: powers-based theories are only taken seriously by those antecedently friendly to them, and prevailing approaches do not benefit from the theoretical resources of the powers approach. At the same time, using the tools of the more dominant strategies would benefit powers-based theories, as some of their key concepts (properties and substances, to name a few) remain underdeveloped. Clearly connecting powers-based theories to the traditional Humean framework will open up greater theoretical resources for both sides.

[1] For more on this problem of causal powers "draining away", see Ned Block's "Do Causal Powers Drain Away?" Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXVII, 1, July 2003, and Jonathan Schaffer's "Is there a Fundamental Level?" Nous 37:3 (2003) 498-517.

[2] Elizabeth Barnes (2012) "Emergence and Fundamentality" Mind 121 (484): 873-901.

[3] Jeff Watson, "The Coherence of Emergence" (MS).

[4] For an alternative view, see Alyssa Ney's "Convergence on the Problem of Mental Causation: Shoemaker's Strategy for (Nonreductive?) Physicalists" Philosophical Issues, Vol. 20, 2010, which argues that the subset theory of causal powers represents agreement between reductive and nonreductive physicalists.

[5] For more on what avoiding overdetermination achieves, see my "Overdetermination Underdetermined" (MS).

[6] For example, see Ruth Groff and John Greco (eds.), Powers and Capacities in Philosophy: the New Aristotelianism, Routledge (2013); Stephen Mumford and Rani Lil Anjum'sGetting Causes from Powers, Oxford (2012); Jonathan Jacobs, Causal Powers, Oxford (forthcoming).

[7] Such as Timothy O'Connor and John Ross Churchill in "Nonreductive Physicalism or Emergent Dualism" in In Robert C. Koons and George Bealer (eds.), The Waning of Materialism: New Essays, Oxford (2009), and O'Connor in conversation.