Mental Causation: Investigating the Mind's Powers in a Natural World

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Jens Harbecke, Mental Causation: Investigating the Mind's Powers in a Natural World, Ontos, 2008, 434pp., €119.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783938793947.

Reviewed by David Robb, Davidson College


This book is a systematic and detailed look at a problem of mental causation, the "exclusion" or "overdetermination" problem. After a critical survey of the literature, Harbecke defends a solution he calls overdeterminationism lite: both the mental and the physical cause behavior, but these are "different kinds of causation" (p. 345), so mental causation does not involve any problematic overdetermination. Some additional metaphysics is behind the view: Harbecke favors a layered ontology of events, one taking its cue from Dennett's work on patterns. And Harbecke defends a counterfactual account of (a kind of) causation, one indebted to Yablo's work on causal proportionality.

The problem of mental causation receives a number of distinct formulations in Chapter 1, but taking center stage is what Harbecke calls the "canonical" formulation. This consists of four independently plausible, but apparently inconsistent, principles (p. 29):

(MC) Mental events cause physical events.

(CP) The realm of the physical is causally complete. [This is earlier glossed as, "for all physical events further physical events can be identified that figure as their sufficient causes" (p. 18).]

(NI) Mental events are not identical with physical events.

(NO) Physical events are not pervasively, or systematically, causally overdetermined.

If there's a standard solution to this version of the problem, it's to reject (NI), thereby embracing token identity. But then the problem reasserts itself at the level of properties, with (MC) and (NI) replaced by:

(MC*) Mental events qua mental -- that is, in virtue of their mental properties -- cause physical events.

(NI*) Mental properties are not identical with physical properties.

These modified principles don't appear in quite this form in the book, but the property version does receive attention from Harbecke -- for example, when he presents a common objection to Davidson's anomalous monism (pp. 98, 120) or reconstructs Kim's supervenience argument (pp. 126 ff.). But Harbecke, who accepts (NI), more often targets the event version, and late in the book he suggests that the property-based problem is fundamentally misguided, perhaps even unintelligible (pp. 314-5): First, he says that properties, which he takes to be types, are abstract entities, and as such cannot enter the causal mix. Questions about a type's being "relevant" are best construed as explanatory, not causal, questions. Second, the property-based problem combines token identity with type distinctness. But such a combination is unstable given that token events can instantiate, or have as a constituent, only one type. In any case, these doubts about the property-based problem, whatever their merits, seem to be relatively isolated in the book. Most of the time, Harbecke treats the property version of the problem as legitimate alongside the event version, frequently switching back and forth between the two.

Chapter 2 criticizes "canonical" solutions to the problem. There are many such solutions to consider, and the pace here is sometimes quite brisk. For example, in a few pages Harbecke sketches a history of emergentism then quickly rejects the view because it violates (CP), a doctrine enjoying, he says, strong empirical support (pp. 110-12). Receiving much more attention is "reductive functionalism", a solution Harbecke associates with David Lewis, Jaegwon Kim, and John Heil, among others. (Most of Harbecke's discussion of this option is carried out in terms of properties, so I assume he is here working with the property-based version of the problem.) For reductive functionalists, mental properties are physical, so (NI*) is false. Multiple realizability, widely believed to establish (NI*), merely shows that what we thought was one mental property is many, each resembling the others closely enough to fall under the same predicate. But all of these mental properties are also physical. Harbecke objects that such a view results in eliminativism:

Mental properties disappear and they give way to physical properties as the referents of our mental predicates (p. 133).

I've seen this sort of charge before -- I favor a version of the reductive view -- but it doesn't stick: If physical properties are "the referents of our mental predicates", in what sense have mental properties disappeared? Aren't they the very physical properties that our mental predicates refer to? On the reductive view, ascriptions of mental states are often true: people are in pain, they have beliefs, and so on. What makes these ascriptions true are physical properties, properties that are also mental because (depending on the case) they have qualitative feel, or they are directly introspectable, or they bestow the appropriate causal powers, or they are representational, etc. This is vindication of the mental, not elimination.

Chapter 3 is devoted to solutions falling under the rubric of "new compatibilism". The leading idea here is "a synthesis of non-identity and non-distinctness" (p. 166). Mental events are not identical with physical events, but they are not entirely distinct either. Here set theory provides an analogy: A set is not identical with one of its (proper) subsets, but the two sets aren't wholly distinct either. According to new compatibilists, every mental event is analogously related to some physical event. New compatibilism promises to reconcile the principles forming the canonical problem. Mental and physical events are distinct, but because the mental is somehow immanent in the physical, the mental can do its causal work through the physical, and so without overdetermination.

New compatibilists include Pereboom, Yablo, Shoemaker, and others. Harbecke has some sympathy with the view, as it resembles his own positive account developed in Chapter 4. But he finds problems in the details. One is "the dilemma of inclusion" (pp. 239-46): Take a mental event m and the physical event p in which it is immanent. Does m include in its essence only physical properties or also some mental properties? If the former, it looks as if m is just p, contrary to (NI). If the latter, the dependence between these mental properties and p's physical properties looks mysterious and brute: "we would get closer to an outright property dualism" (p. 240).

The solution Harbecke favors promises to meet these explanatory demands. This solution, overdeterminationism lite, is the subject of Chapter 4. (A version of causal parallelism also receives a detailed exposition in this chapter, and Harbecke considers it (p. 407) a close second to overdeterminationism lite.)

Harbecke starts with a layered ontology according to which macro-level entities are patterns of the micro-level. Here Dennett's work provides inspiration, though Harbecke rejects instrumentalism, aiming instead for "a full-fledged realism about patterns" on which "the causal status of non-fundamental patterns is not trivial" (p. 320). A central example is a question mark, a pattern of dots arranged a certain way. Here both type and token are multiply realizable: a variety of materials may instantiate the relevant shape-type, and even a particular question mark has enough modal flexibility to have been composed of different dots. A question mark, then, is not identical to the dots of which it is a pattern, but there is an intimate and intelligible dependence here. Indeed, Harbecke suggests (p. 322) that a pattern ontology can deliver "superdupervenience", a kind of dependence that's deeply explanatory, not merely a brute modal relation: we can see how a pattern results from its lower-level elements.

Mental events on this view are, like any macroscopic events, patterns in the microphysical -- or at least this is true of some mental events. Harbecke might not include conscious mental events in the scope of the ontology, for early in the book he sets aside qualia as irrelevant to his purposes:

not even the proponents of the qualia thesis consider qualia as entities equipped with causal powers. Since in the following chapters we are only interested in mental phenomena as causally efficacious phenomena, we are clearly not interested in qualia (p. 67).

The point about qualiaphiles is an exaggeration: not all of them are so quick to embrace epiphenomenalism. But in any case, it seems that all (phenomenally) conscious mental events contain qualia as constituents. So if Harbecke is not interested in qualia, I take it he's not aiming to save the causal efficacy of conscious events, at least not qua conscious events. The account is intended to save the causal efficacy only of the non-conscious -- a more limited, but still significant, goal.

Back to the canonical problem: The pattern ontology yields (NI), since any mental event is distinct from the microphysical realizer of which it is a pattern. And Harbecke considers (MC) and (CP) to be indispensible. So (NO) is abandoned: some physical events -- namely behavioral events -- are systematically overdetermined. However, not all forms of overdetermination are equal, and in fact, some are innocuous (p. 336). Here Harbecke employs some technical machinery developed at length in Chapters 3 and 4, much of it deriving from Yablo's work on causal proportionality. The idea is that effects should be counterfactually sensitive in the appropriate ways to their causes. We can vindicate the causal efficacy of mental events by showing that they satisfy the right counterfactual conditionals. (Yablo's view is just a starting point: Harbecke subjects it to considerable criticism and refinement.)

Harbecke emphasizes that the counterfactuals capturing proportionality are not meant to embody a theory of causality. Indeed, he says the notion of proportionality articulated by these principles is compatible with a range of causal theories including, for example, process theories (p. 278). So it could turn out, I take it, that we find causation proper only at the physical level, where processes such as energy transference occur. Talk of "causation" at the higher levels should then be understood in a weaker, perhaps explanatory, sense -- the "lite" of overdeterminationism lite. But this raises the specter of epiphenomenalism. Here we encounter a familiar dilemma for those who accept (NI): the more robust the causal efficacy granted to the mental, the more it appears as if the mental overdetermines the physical, in violation of (NO). The weaker the causal efficacy granted to the mental, the more the view looks like epiphenomenalism, in violation of (MC). Harbecke goes a long way toward addressing this dilemma, and while I cannot agree with him that overdeterminationism lite "constitutes the most powerful solution to the problem of mental causation known so far" (p. 11), his defense of this strategy is one of the most detailed and thorough to date.