Mental Causation: The Mind-Body Problem

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Anthony Dardis, Mental Causation: The Mind-Body Problem, Columbia University Press, 2008, 195pp., $24.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231144179.

Reviewed by Sara Worley, Bowling Green State University


Anthony Dardis's Mental Causation focuses on the problem of how mental properties can be causally relevant to behavior. We naturally think that they are; indeed, it's part of our fundamental conception of ourselves that we act as we do because we have the reasons we have. But it's hard to see how mental causation can be made consistent with the view that we are parts of the physical world the behavior of which can be explained, in principle, in purely physical terms. But, Dardis argues, if it can't be made consistent, then we will be unable to make sense of the view that our actions can be (adequately) explained by our reasons.

The book can be roughly divided into three parts. In the first, Dardis both motivates the problem and traces the history of philosophical thought about the relationship between mind and body. This section includes reasonably thorough discussions of Plato, Aristotle, and Descartes, as well as a chapter devoted to the various forms of twentieth century materialism. Dardis's aim is not merely historical or exegetical, however. Rather, he argues that any view which involves too radical a separation between the mind and the body, e.g., the views of Plato and Descartes, is going to be unsatisfactory precisely because such a view makes solving the mental causation problem impossible. Some form of materialism is essential. But rather than adopt one or another contemporary form of materialism, Dardis appeals to Aristotle. In particular, he suggests that the Aristotelian distinction between form and matter properties will be helpful.

In the second part of the book, Dardis lays out some of the machinery he needs both to further sharpen the problem and to aid in solving it. This section includes chapters on properties, causation, and the "new logical connections argument" (the thesis that if property a is partially defined by reference to property b, then a cannot be causally relevant to b). Throughout these chapters, the argument is clearly intended to be accessible to undergraduates, or to those who have not had a lot of exposure to the field. He lays out in clear terms, for example, what some of the basic theories about properties are, as well as the difference between Humean and non-Humean theories of causation. However, again his aim is not merely exegetical. He argues for substantive claims, including the thesis that although properties cannot be plausibly identified with sets of particulars, we can nonetheless treat sets of particulars as models of properties. We can thus draw conclusions about how properties are related by considering how the corresponding sets of particulars are related. In addition, the chapter on causation includes an extended argument for the claim that causation requires laws. And in the chapter on the "new logical connections argument" he argues that functionalism is not adequate as a theory of mind, because defining mental properties in functional terms precludes their having causal relevance.

In the final section of the book, Dardis spells out his solution to the mental causation problem. The primary difficulty in making sense of mental causation, Dardis believes, is that causation requires (strict) laws. If mental properties are to be causally relevant to behavior, there must be (strict) laws connecting those mental properties with behavior. But there are a couple of reasons for doubting the existence of appropriate laws. Consider the generalization that anyone who has a certain mental state behaves in such and such a way. This generalization obviously is not true, in the first instance because how one behaves never depends on just a single mental state, but on a larger set of mental states. Dardis notes, however, that this sort of complexity is the norm. Properties typically work together, and not necessarily in an additive way. So generally the effects that an event has will depend on the constellation of properties had by that event. Causal relevance of a property F requires not that there be a law to the effect that any event which has F will be followed by an event which has Y, but rather that there be a law to the effect that any event which has F, G, H, and I … will produce an effect with property Y. Dardis calls these more complex laws "swatch laws."

But the more serious problem for mental causation is that not even suitable swatch laws seem to obtain, because of the fact that mental properties supervene on distinct sets of physical properties. Different physical properties have different causal powers. So what precisely someone who has mental properties F, G, H, and I will do depends not merely on F, G, H, and I, but on the particular physical realization of those properties. Furthermore, there is, seemingly, no way to bolster these laws in order to make them more complete except by appealing to the details of the underlying lower level laws. And the fact that we need to appeal to the underlying laws suggests that it's the underlying properties which are really doing the causal work.

What we need, then, if mental causation is to be possible, is some way to construct a closed system of higher level laws, parallel to the closed system of fundamental physical laws. Here is where Aristotle's distinction between form and matter comes in. Dardis illustrates his point by considering a teacup. Suppose that any event which has the properties A, B, C, and D is the event of pouring hot tea into a (porcelain) teacup. Property A is the set of physical properties on which that teacup supervenes, and properties B, C, and D are the properties associated with the pouring. Instances of property G are instances of containing the hot liquid. So there is a swatch law:

(a) Anything which has A, B, C, and D will have G.

But of course this is not a higher level law, since A is a physical property. So suppose that we replace A with T, the (higher level) property of being a teacup. Then we get

(b) Anything which has T, B, C, and D will have G.

The problem with (b) is that it's not true. Whether or not a particular teacup will hold hot liquid depends on what the teacup is made of. (b) holds well enough for porcelain teacups, but not for teacups made of ice.

Dardis's solution is to replace A with the conjunction of T and H, where T is, as before, the property of being a teacup, and H is the matter property of being any actual or possible arrangement of exactly the same amount and kind of matter as constitutes the teacup. Then the swatch law

(c) Anything that has T, H, B, C, and D will have G

is both true and entirely higher-level. It's true because the conjunction of T and H is equivalent to A, so (c) is true so long as (a) is true. And it's entirely higher level, because both T and H are higher level properties (the property of being any actual or possible arrangement of a certain amount and type of matter is not a property that one finds in fundamental physics). And of course the assumption is that a similar move can be made with respect to mental properties. Mental properties are form properties, so appropriate swatch laws should be formulable by conjoining mental properties with suitable matter properties.

Dardis's claim, then, is that by appeal to both form and matter properties we can construct a complete, closed system of higher order laws, thus allowing for mental (or other higher level) causation.

Dardis's argument is intriguing. However, there are a couple of worries that one might have. The first worry can be highlighted by focusing on an argument he gives in favor of the claim that properties which are logically connected can't also be causally connected. Consider, for example, sunburn. Instances of sunburn are, of course, caused by exposure to the sun. But is exposure to the sun the causally relevant property? Dermal burns can be caused by exposure to a variety of things, including the sun, sunlamps, and perhaps other sources of the right sort of radiation. Now we have a choice. On the one hand, we can regard each of these causal paths as representing a separate "motor of the world." Thus there is one motor of the world leading from sun exposure to burns, another from sunlamp exposure to burns, and another from exposure to one of these other sources of radiation to burns. Each of these exposures would be a causally relevant property.

On the other hand, more perspicuously, we could also conclude that there's a single mechanism at work here in all these cases, a single "motor of the world." The causally relevant property would then be the property involved in all these cases, i.e., exposure to a certain sort of radiation. So it's not exposure to the sun which is causally relevant to sunburn; rather, it's exposure to radiation which is causally relevant to dermal burns. Instances of exposure to the sun are just instances of exposure to radiation, and it's this latter property which is relevant.

But it's not clear why an analogous argument wouldn't show that the multiplicity of form/matter properties are also not causally relevant. Surely we don't want to say that there's one motor of the world which explains why this teacup holds hot liquids, another motor which explains why this, slightly larger, teacup also holds hot liquids, and yet a third which explains why this vase holds hot liquids. (The matter properties have to be different in all three cases on the assumption that the amount of matter differs in each case. Vases and teacups also differ with respect to their form properties.) Rather, it's more perspicuous to suppose that there's a single mechanism, a single motor of the world, at work in all these cases, and the particular cases are just instances of this more fundamental mechanism. But if the fact that there's a more fundamental mechanism is enough to show that being exposed to the sun is not a causally relevant property, why isn't the existence of this more fundamental mechanism enough to show that being a porcelain teacup, say, is not a causally relevant property?

There is also a second worry about these laws, and that's whether these higher level swatch laws can really be made strict. I recently had the misfortune of having an entire cup of hot coffee leak out of a porcelain coffee mug. The seal between the sides of the cup and the bottom had apparently given way, so that although the cup looked intact, it was no longer capable of holding liquids. But what are we to say about this case? It's a bit hard to see how to reconcile the leak with the purported law that anything which has (a) the matter property of being made of porcelain plus (b) the form property of being a coffee mug plus (c) the complex of properties which amounts to having hot coffee poured into it will produce (d) the event of holding hot coffee. One might try to suppose that the mug no longer has the form property of being a coffee mug since having an intact seal is essential to being a coffee mug, but this move seems a little risky. It seems to be uncomfortably close to saying that anything that doesn't in fact hold coffee (or other hot liquids) is, in effect, not a coffee cup, thus risking conflict with the "new logical connections argument." Moreover it seems that what's really gone wrong with my coffee cup is not that it is no longer a coffee cup, but rather that it has acquired some physical property, and it's the presence of this physical property which explains why it no longer holds liquids. In other words, it seems that the way to bolster this law is to supplement it by appeal to lower level laws. But that need to supplement by appeal to lower level laws was precisely what the move to form and matter properties was intended to allow us to avoid.

Despite these flaws in the argument, the book has many virtues. It would be, I think, especially well suited for use in an upper-division undergraduate course in metaphysics or the philosophy of mind. Dardis explains the issues and problems clearly, and succeeds in making the worries about mental causation compelling. He also does a nice job at integrating historical and contemporary arguments. Professional philosophers also will learn from the detailed argument in some of the chapters. So all in all, Dardis has produced a valuable contribution.