Mental Files

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François Recanati, Mental Files, Oxford University Press, 2012, 280pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199659982

Reviewed by Paolo Leonardi, Università di Bologna


Through the years, François Recanati has developed a large and coherent picture of language and thought, integrating semantics and pragmatics, and subscribing to direct reference without giving up the connection between semantics and cognition. To that picture, his latest book adds an account of singular thoughts. Singular thoughts are relational,[1] are indexically presented, and (their vehicles) refer to what they gain information from via that epistemically rewarding relation. Perceptual acquaintance is the paradigm case of an epistemically rewarding relation. The vehicles of singular thoughts are mental files, into which the information gained -- which needs not be veridical -- is stored. Mental files are the vehicles of singular thoughts, as words are the vehicles for expression.

When I am perceptually acquainted with the White Mountain in the Alps, my mind opens up an indexical file into which flows information from that mountain. The White Mountain is then presented to me as that from which I gain that information. That mode of presentation is not descriptive -- i.e., knowledge by acquaintance involves a mode of presentation as knowledge by description does, but in the acquaintance case it is a non-descriptive mode. "X is covered with snow", I think.

A mental file has a double semantic role, as I said: it refers to an object and presents it as what the file gains from the information flowing into it. Hence, Recanati' thought singularism: hissemantics of singular terms has two-levels, sense and reference. In the mental file picture, "Informational integration and inferential exploitation of information only takes place within files" (43). When we presume identity, we exploit information within one single file. When we express a judgment of identity  we instead link two (or more) mental files and sometimes merge the information they store into a single one, often preserving records of the previous stage and of the merging. In the second case, Recanati speaks of incremental conversion. This is a first hint at the files' dynamics.

David Kaplan's theory of indexicals is Recanati's model for investigating mental files, a model he integrates with suggestions by Charles S. Peirce and Hans Reichenbach (57). These are the key features of an indexical file: (i) it has two dimensions, "corresponding to character and content" – "standing meaning and reference" ; (ii) "reference is determined through contextual relations" ; (iii) the standing meaning "reflects the relation between token and referent" (59). Since a file exploits an epistemically rewarding relation, it should, as a normative requirement, exist only in so far as the subject is acquainted with some entity. Actually, however, an indexical file is usually converted, when the context changes, from a demonstrative into a memory demonstrative file, and, as we will see, from a demonstrative file into a file of some further kind. But the demonstrative files remain, according to Recanati, the basic ones.

In a refined view, proto-files are the ones claimed to host only information gained in virtue of the epistemically rewarding relation with the referent. They are deemed to evolve into files that continue to be a vehicle for the same referent, which are enriched with predicates applied to the referent but acquired in some other way, like someone's telling us.

Given that a subject is constantly in an epistemically rewarding relation to herself, the self file is an indexical stable file. There are other files more stable than demonstrative ones, like the recognitional files, which are produced by repeated exposure to the object, making it familiar to the subject. And there are encyclopedic files too, files determined by a higher-order epistemically rewarding relation, which occurs between a subject and an object just in case there are some first-order relations in which the subject stands to the object (74). In time, a demonstrative file is converted, as I anticipated, into a memory demonstrative one, and this into a recognitional file on re-encountering the object -- a recognition depending on the subject's "nonconceptual capacity to recognize" (88). Often, the conversion is incremental, adding other relations to the first epistemically rewarding one. By now, we have a somewhat better understanding of the files dynamics.

The content of mental files grounds presumptions of identity and identity judgments. Does it follow that the content of a file is transparent to the subject? Arguing that externalism and self-knowledge are compatible, Recanati considers, among others, the following example:

1. JO once loved playing in WATER.
2. JO does not like playing in WATER now.
3. JO has changed.

In the story, Peter has a sister, Jo. Jo loves playing with water. Somehow, Peter moves to Twin-Earth and there he comes to know Twin-Jo. Being unaware of having moved from Earth to Twin-Earth, Peter thinks he has to do all the time with Jo. As a consequence, on the one hand, he (pragmatically) refers with "Jo" to Twin-Jo (step 2), on the other hand by the recognitional file he uses, he has beliefs about Jo (step 1). But Peter is not confused, asserts Recanati:

That the two occurrences fail to corefer even though they are de jure coreferential does not show that the subject is mistaken and that transparency fails. Indeed the factive characterization of coreference de jure can be maintained in the face of such examples : the subject knows that the two occurrences corefer if they refer at all. In the cases at hand, precisely, the two occurrences do not refer. (132)

The mental file Peter uses in the reasoning is appropriately related to two entities and not to one. Hence, Peter doesn't really think either of Jo or of Twin Jo. (Peter is likewise not confused about water and twin-water.)

Discussing Robin Jeshion's claim that there are descriptive names -- "Neptune," for instance, was a descriptive name originally introduced by Le Verrier for the planet that he conjectured perturbated Uranus' orbit -- Recanati deals with whether there are singular thoughts not installed by acquaintance with what they are about. Recanati does not concede the case in general, but allows for singular thoughts without acquaintance in some cases, distinguishing among expected acquaintance, imagined acquaintance, actualizing function, and discourse reference. The cases are exemplified by the use of "Jack the Ripper" by the London police, by a couple considering adoption and giving a name to the still imaginary adopted, by giving the name "Tommy" to the average British soldier, or by speaking of our nephew writing a letter to Santa Claus.

The last two parts of Mental Files are dedicated to attitude ascriptions and to Frege's sense of 'I' and the Donnellan case, respectively. On attitude ascriptions, more so than in the preceding chapters, the book follows the lead of Hans Kamp's Discourse Representation Theory. In the Donnellan case, Recanati argues that both referential uses, as attributive ones, are semantic. A description in attributive use denotes but doesn't refer; a description in referential use, satisfied by what it refers to, denotes and refers; a description in referential use not satisfied by what it refers to, pragmatically refers, but not semantically.

The book has many virtues: a clear claim, a clean structure, and a complete mastery of contemporary literature on the subject.[2] There are, however, a couple of points about which I am uneasy.

A basic uneasiness: I wonder whether a file[3] can play the vehicle role, and what is meant here by "vehicle." A vehicle of thought is something for taking information in and for tracing back to a source of information. In the first direction, the file is no vehicle -- it does not take information in but stores information. The thought I have is not the file but the bundle of information it stores. In the other direction, the file again is no vehicle. If the file were opaque, we would trace back its source of information only by opening it, and once we had done that, not the file itself but its content would be relevant. If the file were transparent, and its content searchable without opening it, the difference would be just that: we would not have to open it. Still, not the file but its content would be relevant, because it is the content of the file, and not the file, that enables us to recognize the object from which we gain information. The folder is of no interest but for one aspect, namely that itbundles the information it contains. My problem is that a file is no sign. Files are distinguished by what they contain, and by their names (or by the label on the folder) -- or by acting in ways that make them perceivably different (color, model, etc.). The files in my computer have a name, and that's a difference. A language whose only singular terms were "this" and "that" ("this" and "this") would not allow us to say much -- an idea which was well captured by that of names functioning "as pegs on which to hang descriptions," as John Searle claimed (1958, p. 172), and if not names, then mental counterparts of them.[4]

A second uneasiness: We resort to files to keep things in order, but to have things in order is not yet to account for them. There are bundles of information, one from one object, another from another, a third from a third object, etc.; there are bundles of bundles of information, or incremented bundles of information, collected on many occasions and stored in recognitional files; there are encyclopedic bundles of information; etc. Of course, in Mental Files, elements of an account surface in the labels of the different kinds of file and in the relations among kinds of file, as when the conversion of files -- and the links among them -- are mentioned. But the whole machinery is only tangentially treated, and no part of it is explained in detail. Just one example: an object recognitional file is said to be established when "multiple exposure to that object has created and maintained in the subject a disposition to recognize that object" (Recanati 2006: 251, quoted at 71). This does very little to account for recognition, and nothing is said about how recognition works once a recognition file is established.

Although much information is claimed to be subpersonally processed, what is in the files is what is in Kamp's discourse representation, i.e., predicates and variables, and sets of them, i.e., abstract linguistic entities, if not linguistic entities tout court. This format of representation seems to me in contrast with one of Recanati's tenets, according to which "the subject is directly acquainted with the object in experience and does not think of it descriptively as the instantiator of such and such property." (13) Perhaps, the subject doesn't consciously linguisticize information. Anyway, it is unlikely that the content of a file generated by perceptual acquaintance has only a linguistic format. A suggestion à la Wittgenstein to see my point is to imagine translating all the information we get into a linguistic, or quasi-linguistic, format. It would not only be costly, but in many cases it would make the information harder to access and use. I can still see the wonder on his face, but I have no proper words to describe it to you. When I walk from the railway station to my office, there are a lot of things I see, take notice of, reply to properly, without ever putting it in words or quasi-words. I avoid crashing into a hundred of pedestrians -- calculating their speed and directions, and continuously adjusting my own speed and direction. I skip holes in the pavement, avoid the roots of the plants which shadow the lane, etc. In doing all that, I haven't even the time to tell what I am doing. Besides, if I were to meet François Hollande, I might recognize him, having seen many pictures of him. If I had only read many descriptions of how he looks -- even detailed and well done descriptions -- it would be much harder to succeed at the same feat.

In a previous paper (2006), Recanati speaks rather of concepts than of files. Here, words related to "concept" occasionally pop up, but he is much more careful and tentative about concepts, explicitly devoting to them only a short appendix to chapter 8. Traditionally, concepts are natural ingredients in a mental file. But the appendix does not allow any such claim, and is limited to suggesting that concepts develop out of indexical files.

Finally, I doubt that the issues dealt with in the book can be settled by focusing only on the mind bracketing what is external to it. Our mind is molded by its environment, as Recanati the contextualist knows very well. The reference of not only singular terms but also of predicates depends on context -- how can we otherwise learn what "light," "navigate," or "eat" mean? If I am right, how thought represents things cannot be investigated independently of the world to which what is thought of belongs  -- i.e., independently of what the files supposedly relate us to.

Mental Files raises some great issues and investigates some major problems with lucid and rich arguments. Hence, the book is more than worth reading, and its lucidity both induces agreement and helps at clarifying one's dissent.


K. Bach (1986). "Thought and Object : De Re Representations and Relations" (in M. Brand & R.M. Harnish eds The Representation of Knowledge and Belief. Tucson: The University of Arizona Press, pp. 187-218).

J. Perry (1980). "A Problem about Continued Belief" (Pacific Philosophical Quarterly 61: 317-332).

F. Recanati (2006). "Indexical Concepts and Compositionality (in M. Garcia-Carpintero and J. Macia eds. Two-Dimensional Semantics. Oxford: Clarendon Press, pp. 249-57).

J.R. Searle (1958). "Proper Names" (Mind 67: 166-73).

[1] Reference is relational rather than satisfactional. As Recanati reminds us, this apt terminology is from Bach (1986).

[2] However, its argument would have looked more linear if the attention to the literature were limited to footnotes.

[3] The file metaphor is old, and Recanati’s list of people exploiting it is impressive. Perry (1980)’s use of the notion is the one closest to Recanati, as he himself acknowledges.

[4] The Oxford English Dictionary, in relation to computing says that a file collects data "under a single identifying name," and the name, or its mental counterpart, is what I feel is missing.