Mereology: A Philosophical Introduction

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Giorgio Lando, Mereology: A Philosophical Introduction, Bloomsbury, 2017, 237pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472583666.

Reviewed by Kris McDaniel, Syracuse University


This book has two aims. First, it aims to be an introduction to some of the most important issues in the metaphysics of parts and wholes. Second, it aims to defend a specific metaphysical view about parts and wholes, which Giorgio Lando calls "mereological monism". I think the book largely succeeds with respect to both aims, which was no easy task: it is hard to simultaneously introduce and contribute to a scholarly debate. The book is carefully and clearly written, and the arguments are presented in a fair and even-handed way. It is not overburdened with symbolic notation, which was a welcome surprise given that typical articles on mereology are filled with symbolic formulae. For these reasons, the book is certainly suitable for use as a textbook in graduate seminars on the metaphysics of parts and wholes, but it is also accessible enough that it could also be used in upper-division undergraduate metaphysics classes. Philosophers who are curious to see what some of the main issues in the metaphysics of parts and wholes are would also profit from reading this book.

Lando uses the label "mereological monism" for the claim that classical mereology is the correct theory of the parthood relation that concrete entities bear to each other. Classical mereology can be stated as a theory consisting of three axioms about parts and wholes: that parthood is transitive, that composition is unique, and that composition is unrestricted. The structure of the book, which is divided into an introduction, three primary parts, and an appendix, mostly reflects this way of axiomatizing classical mereology. The introduction and part one primarily focus on methodological issues in the metaphysics of parts and wholes, among which Lando includes the question of whether mereology is a part of logic (he argues that it is not) and the question of in what sense mereology is formal. With respect to the latter question, Lando (pp. 10-11) argues that mereology is formal only in the sense that it is highly (but not maximally) topic-neutral. Part one also addresses head-on challenges to the transitivity of parthood (pp. 47-50). Part two focuses on challenges to the claim that composition is unique. Part three focuses on challenges to the claim that composition is unrestricted. The appendix addresses the question of whether composition is identity. There, Lando argues that we should reject the claim that composition is identity even if we embrace what he calls mereological monism.

In what follows, I'll briefly discuss some of the arguments that Lando articulates for the three axioms of classical mereology. The book really is quite comprehensive on this front, so what I will discuss is just a small snapshot of a very expansive landscape.

Briefly, Lando's defense of transitivity consists of careful examination and subsequent rejection of putative counter-examples. Lando distinguishes two strategies. The first is to appeal to a relation of selective parthood, which is partially defined in terms of unselective parthood. The mereological monist says that unselective parthood is transitive, but grants that there are many selective parthood relations that are not. Lando argues that, with respect to some of the putative counterexamples, selective transitivity is the relation (covertly) invoked. The other strategy is to argue that in some cases in which we are inclined to use the word "part", parthood is not actually invoked. Consider Lando's (p. 49) example: the left arm is part of the MP; the MP is part of the parliament; so the left arm is part of the parliament. The conclusion sounds bad. Lando's response is that it is plausible that the second occurrence of "part" refers to something like membership rather than parthood, and so the argument is invalid.

Lando takes the central challenge to extensionality in the realm of concrete objects to be the puzzle of material constitution. The statue does not seem to be identical with the lump of matter coincident with it, since the statue has modal properties and value properties (such as aesthetic properties) that the lump lacks. Lando considers a number of responses to this challenge, but seems to put the most weight on the response that, if we distinguish the statue and the lump for these reasons, we should also distinguish further parts of the statue from further parts of the lump, and so the statue and the lump are consistent with extensionalism (see pp. 104-109). For example, perhaps the statue has a left arm as a proper part, while the lump has a corresponding left-arm-shaped lump as a proper part. Of course, this works only if there is no level of decomposition at which the statue and the lump have the same proper parts, such as, perhaps at the level of subatomic particles (see pp. 108-109). But, pace Lando, the natural implementation of this view is not one in which at every level of decomposition there are coincident objects; that response seems to presuppose unrestricted composition as well, which the anti-extensionalist might not accept. Consider a human person and the lump of matter that constitutes the person. Perhaps the lump of matter has a proper part corresponding to every way of partitioning the particles that compose it, but it is by no means obvious the human person does. In addition to modal and axiological properties, the proponent of anti-extensionalism appeals to a distinction between kinds of things: the human person is a different kind of thing than the lump of matter. But besides the kind lump of matter, there is no other distinctive kind corresponding to arbitrary fusions of the mereological atoms that make up the lump (and the human person).

In addition to a defense of extensionality, part two discusses various ways in which a formal mereological theory might countenance or reject kinds of mereological structure, how to understand extensionalism given that objects can change parts across time, and considerations against adopting extensionalism for the putative parthood relation that abstract entities enjoy.

Lando takes the central challenge to unrestricted composition to be intuitions about nonexistence: it just doesn't seem like there is something made out of the Eiffel Tower and John Cleese, but rather it seems that there is not something made out of them! Lando distinguishes between intuitions as evidence and intuitions as motivations to theorize (p. 190). I take it that relevant instances of the former kind would be evidence against unrestricted composition while relevant instances of the latter kind would provide an incentive to clarify why unrestricted composition is compatible with them. Lando suggests that once we accept an account of existence that is "thin" -- to be is simply to be identical with something rather than to have causal powers, or to be internally unified -- we will not be swayed by these intuitions (pp. 190-191). And since Lando takes the positive case for unrestricted composition to be strong -- it largely consists in the argument from vagueness (chapter 13) -- he concludes that we should accept unrestricted composition.

In addition to a defense of unrestricted composition, part three discusses the role of plural quantification in formulating mereological theories, whether mereology is a part of logic, and the connections between mereology and metaontology.

I have one quibble about how Lando sets up the dialectic between his "mereological monism" and its competitors, which in turn is reflected in his choice of terminology. As I see things, there are at least three questions that should be distinguished. First, is there just one parthood relation, which a variety of kinds of entities exemplify, or is there more than one? Second, for any kind of entity that exemplifies a parthood relation, are the rules that govern that parthood relation the same? Third, if the rules are that govern parthood in each case are the same, are those rules the axioms of classical mereology? These are different questions and they should be treated as such. In the extant literature on compositional monism and compositional pluralism, "monism" is typically reserved for the affirmative answer to the first question and "pluralism" for the negative answer. (In fact, Lando sometimes seems to use "monism" and "pluralism" in just this way; see, e.g., p. 31 and p. 92.) It struck me that Lando's choice to label his view "mereological monism" was misleading, since his mereological monism is consistent with pluralism so understood. And one can be a mereological monist (but not in Lando's sense) while rejecting classical mereology: for example, one might think that there is exactly one parthood relation, but it does not obey the axioms of classical mereology. Some of the arguments Lando offers for what he calls mereological monism equally well support a kind of mereological monism that rejects classical mereology. (See, for example, the argument on p. 31 that is based on the idea that pluralism about parthood never allows one to conclusively settle whether a putative parthood relation is a parthood relation.) But I do not think this sort of view is even mentioned let alone critically evaluated, which strikes me as an opportunity missed. At best, if Lando's arguments for the three axioms of classical mereology succeed, the positions that Lando neglects are ruled out. But since the arguments for each of three axioms seem independent of each other, I think he should be more confident in each of them than he is in their conjunction, and so it would have been useful to have at least some discussion of other versions of mereological monism that are not committed to classical mereology.

I don't want to end on a quibble though, so let me reiterate that this is a very good book. It systematically covers a lot of territory, and is a welcome addition to the literature on parts and wholes.


I thank Ross Cameron for reading and commenting on a draft of this review.