Mereology and Location

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Shieva Kleinschmidt (ed.), Mereology and Location, Oxford University Press, 2014, xxxiii + 254pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199593828.

Reviewed by A. J. Cotnoir, University of St Andrews


This book is awesome in the same way that a new compendium to the Star Wars expanded universe would be to a super-fan: it feels like Christmas in hardback. But if you're not already into that kind of thing, flipping through the book might leave you quizzical. While the book is really aimed at enthusiasts, my review is aimed at the casual observer and infrequent participant. I'll try to point out some of the more accessible contributions, and highlight some of the interesting results. But first some context.

About fifteen to twenty years ago the war over the persistence of material objects was raging. Are objects entirely located at every time in which they exist? Or do objects have temporal parts as well as spatial parts? (Notice that already we see a location-based conception of persistence vs. a mereological conception.) The literature exploded. After the dust had settled, metaphysicians began to return to the scene of the battle and take stock. And the aftermath was inevitably messy and complicated. The debate over persistence became more general --  it is increasingly clear that we cannot hope to provide answers to questions about how objects are located in time without also considering how they are located in space, or simply spacetime. It is also clear that debates over mereological principles have direct relevance to the debates over spacetime locations, and vice versa. This volume can be seen as contributing to the rebuilding project; the papers offer new and insightful arguments and theories that treat these traditional topics in creative ways.

The editor's introduction serves its purpose well: it schematizes and organizes the issues, and provides nice clean summaries of the main theses of each contribution. Much of this literature requires familiarity with a number of different formal mereologies alongside various formal theories of location. Writing an introduction to a volume like this is to undertake the seemingly impossible task of summarizing piles of technical literature over the course of a few pages. But Shieva Kleinschmidt pulls it off admirably. Her introduction contains a lovely introduction to the industry standard classical extensional mereology as well as the basics of three formal theories of location. (Those wanting a more thorough grounding in the technical work could consult chapters 3 and 4 of Casati and Varzi (1999).) For an introduction to the volume, though, this is pitched just right.

With any complicated subject matter, the place to start are the papers that make a simplifying assumption. There are three that attempt to reduce the parthood relation to a locative relation. Ned Markosian's "A Spatial Approach to Mereology" is probably the most accessible; anyone interested in these topics would do well to start here. He argues for a spatial approach to mereology. In particular, he defends the view that x is a part of y if and only if the location of x is a subregion of the location of y. The view is simple, elegant, and intuitive. There are trade-offs, of course, as Markosian is forced to accept that location and existence for objects (even composites) is a brute matter. But there is much to like about the approach, and the paper would serve as a nice first course.

A natural follow-on is Daniel Nolan's more radical reductive approach. Nolan advocates for super-substantivalism, the view that material objects are identical to regions of spacetime. For him, regions of spacetime are described by generalizing Tarski's system: they are gunky in that they always have proper subregions, and extended in that there are no pointy or zero-dimensional regions. Importantly, not all of these regions count as material objects; only those that instantiate certain patterns of basic properties are. Parthood, then, is the subregion relation restricted to such objects. However, we aren't told what those patterns are or what basic principles they satisfy; as a result we have almost no information about what mereological principles hold. It might be that composition never occurs, or that the mereology is radically non-extensional, or that natural supplementation principles fail, or that two objects with large spatial overlap fail to mereologically overlap. This will have surprising knock-on effects, too. Simple material objects might persist in a way that is neither a kind of perdurantism nor endurantism, but as extending through their spacetime regions without having temporal parts ('spanning'). Which regions are material objects might be vague without there being any vagueness in existence. As a result, many questions that were previously thought to be mereological end up becoming questions whose answers depend on what it takes for a region to count as a 'material object'. Exploring the range of ways of supplementing the theory with answers may prove to be a promising way forward.

The third reductivist paper also gets the prize as the weirdest. In "Parthood is Identity", Kris McDaniel argues for the thesis that the parthood relation just is the identity relation. This is not to be confused with what is known as strong composition as identity: the thesis that a whole is identical to all of its parts, taken collectively. No, McDaniel defends what Lewis (1991) called stronger and stranger composition as identity: the whole is identical to each of its parts individually. Yes, you read that correctly; the parthood relation is the identity relation. Well, maybe not the identity-according-to-contemporary-orthodoxy relation. Rather, McDaniel explores the view that numerical identity is relative to a spacetime index, like temporary identity generalized. He says, "It is kind of weird. But if you don't think temporary identity is so weird that it should be dismissed out of hand, I don't get why you'd think this view should be" (p. 32). Here are a couple reasons. Unlike temporary identity, McDaniel's parthood-as-identity may be relative to a region whose points are merely space-like separated rather than merely time-like separated, and so the relation requires a restriction of Leibniz's Law to 'region-free' properties. Also, parthood-as-identity is irreflexive and asymmetric. (It's hard to think about an irreflexive identity relation.) Despite its weirdness -- because of it? -- this is one of the volume's more interesting papers. Philosophers should welcome radical and strange positions that push on the boundaries of our concepts. And this paper does exactly that.

Given that Josh Parsons (2007) has been foundational to the literature on location, it is somewhat surprising that his "The Many Primitives of Mereology" is the only purely mereological contribution. Mereologies are typically formulated using a single primitive notion, but which notion gets to be primitive is not standard. Some theorists choose parthood, others proper parthood, still others overlap or disjointness. (Parsons does not address theorists like Fine (2010) who treat composition as primitive.) As far as I'm aware, this is the first systematic attempt to address the question as to which mereologies are axiomatizable using a given primitive. Parsons does a very careful job distinguishing, e.g., different notions of proper parthood that have been sometimes run together in the literature. He also takes a stand on necessary conditions for any formal system to count as a mereology: (i) parthood must be reflexive, (ii) transitive, and (iii) overlap must be definable in terms of sharing a part. Most helpfully, he highlights the importance of Strong Supplementation -- the disparaged little sibling to the overrated Weak Supplementation principle.

There are three chapters for those who have more of an interest in the philosophy of language. The place to start is Kathrin Koslicki's "Mereological Sums and Singular Terms". Koslicki argues that accepting classical mereology carries with it a semantic cost. She suggests that our practice of using singular terms is bound up with referring to things having persistence conditions that classical mereological sums do not have. As such, it puts those who accept classical mereology at a disadvantage (other things being equal) in doing semantics for natural languages. Her main target is the foremost proponent of classical mereology: David Lewis. Following P. F. Strawson, she carves out a specific role for singular terms and marshals an argument from Gareth Evans against the Lewisian view. Along the way Koslicki productively engages with a wide range of considerations from language (inscrutability, vagueness, reference magnetism, and more). Throughout the paper, she presumes that classical mereologists are committed to a mereological essentialism, namely that "the [existence and] identity of a sum depends on nothing more than the [existence and] identity of its parts" (p. 212, cf. 216), and "Given the identity conditions governing mereological sums, each of [them] has its proper parts essentially" (p. 232). Koslicki draws on the Unrestricted Fusion and Unique Fusion principles for motivation. But it is unclear that there is anything in the axioms of classical mereology that forces this particular conception of mereological sums. Still, it is true that Lewis, Armstrong, and others accept the additional thesis; so the point does not seriously affect her argument.

Gabriel Uzquiano's excellent "Mereology and Modality" directly addresses this issue. He asks whether classical mereology entails the sort of mereological essentialism Koslicki suggests. (He argues that it doesn't). He considers whether necessitating the axioms will do the trick. (It won't). He also considers whether there is an argument from the necessity of identity to the necessity of parthood. (There isn't.) So, Uzquiano shows that securing mereological essentialism is a lot trickier than one would expect. Still though, he concludes that there is a principled way of extending classical mereology to ensure mereological essentialism; opponents of mereological essentialism would do well to reject classical mereology.

The other contribution that intersects with philosophy of language is Cody Gilmore's massive and densely argued "Parts of Propositions". A natural question arises for Russellians about propositions: is the relation between constituents and their propositions the part-whole relation? Presumably not, as Frege noted, since if parthood is transitive, then any part of a constituent would also be a constituent of the proposition. Similarly, if composition is unique, then the constituents Heloise, Abelard, and loves would make for exactly one proposition. Gilmore attempts to solve these problems. His paper is about as complicated as they come: it utilizes a four-place parthood relation 'x at y is a part of z at w', where y and w are locations. How would this help since standardly abstracta like propositions are not thought to be located at all? Gilmore argues that propositions have slots as locations. More specifically, a universal corresponding to n-ary predicate has n-many objectual slots; a connectant corresponding to a n-ary connective has n-many predicative slots. We can then understand the parthood relation as being doubly relative to slot locations. This paper is not for the inexperienced. Even the adept will find the going tough at times. Still the paper ably defends a rich and unified theory, which represents the state-of-the-art in the field.

Each of the final trio of papers deals with the spatial and temporal dimensions more directly. (As a side note, it is nice to see that many of the papers are sensitive to the issues raised by non-Euclidean spacetime of the sort required by relativity: Nolan p. 93f; Peter Forrest pp. 118, 124; Peter Simons pp. 62, 68; Hud Hudson p. 136.) The first deals with location along the spatial dimension, the second with location along the spatial and temporal dimensions, and the third with location along temporal and hypertemporal(!) dimensions.

In "Conflicting Intuitions About Space", Peter Forrest shows that eleven premises are jointly inconsistent. Forrest claims that each premise "is either directly intuitive or supported by intuitions" (p. 118). Some of them are theses some philosophers will have settled views about: e.g., mereological universalism (premise two), or the axiom of choice (for premise eleven). Most of the other premises require certain facts that link spatial volume and parthood (premises one, seven, eight) or volume and summation (premise nine, ten, eleven). This is the most technically difficult paper, and I must confess it took several readings to understand it properly. To be fair, Forrest makes a concerted effort to show how each of the premises is shored up by 'intuitive' considerations, but I suspect many readers will find at certain points that they fail to have the requisite intuition either way. Perhaps making the task more difficult are certain stipulations that constrain how we can read the premises (i.e., that mereological sums are always least upper bounds, or infinitesimal differences in diameter are to be ignored). But difficult as it may be, the argument is philosophically important. If correct, it would have far-reaching consequences. A handful of the premises entail that every sum of points -- countable or uncountable -- has zero volume. This would rule out the mathematically standard view that all regions are sums of zero-dimensional points. The premises also rule out certain sorts of spatial structures having positive volume (Lebesgue measure) but are totally disconnected (some 'Fat Cantor Sets' are examples; contra Forrest (p. 130, fn. 3), the Menger-Sierpinski sponge is not an example). But which premise should be rejected? It's hard to say, but I'd be inclined to reject the first premise -- not every region with a positive volume has a connected part.

Distinguish between two types of location along a dimension: entending (wholly present at each point) vs. pertending (present by virtue of having a part at each point). Along a temporal dimension, this distinction is familiar: endurance vs. perdurance. But things might be located across space in each way as well. Peter Simons's "Where It's At" argues for admitting entities of each type into our ontology. Continuants (ordinary objects) are spread out in space but endure through time; occurrents (events) are spread out through space and perdure through time; and types (universals) are multiply located in space and endure through time. (Simons is slightly less sanguine about the fourth category of situations multiply located in space but perdure through time.) Simons takes occurrents to be ontologically basic, cleverly showing how continuants and types can be derived via Fregean abstraction principles.

What if only the past and present exist? The universe would be like a growing block increasing in volume as time passes. Some growing block theorists, in order to make sense of time's passing, postulate a second time-like dimension, 'hypertime', in which the block can grow and its rate of growth can be measured. Hud Hudson's "Transhypertime Identity" tells two stories (one hyperstory?) of Captain Quag, a hypertime resident and interstellar traveler. I don't want to spoil the fun, but let me just say that events that are past hyperbecome so no longer, and events that are hyperpast become present. All the old debates about temporal persistence reemerge as new debates about hypertemporal persistence. Does Captain Quaq hyperperdure? Or hyperendure? Or something else entirely? Anyone familiar with persistence debates should read this paper for the thrill of warping your mind to accommodate hypertime.

This volume is loaded with interesting papers of the highest quality. Virtually all of them directly engage with the question of the interaction between mereology and the spatial, temporal, and modal dimensions. As such the volume is highly focused and unified. By taking a slightly wider gaze and carefully working out how mereology and spatiotemporality (and indeed modality) relate, a great deal of light is shed on some of the traditional problems in metaphysics. The number of original approaches, each worked out with careful (sometimes technical) precision, is striking. Formally inclined metaphysicians will love the book -- a "can't miss" for specialists. Even non-specialists will find something to like -- you'll just have to locate the right part.


Casati, R. & Varzi, A. (1999). Parts and Places. MIT Press.

Fine, K. (2010). Towards a theory of part. Journal of Philosophy 107 (11): 559-589.

Lewis, D. (1991). Parts of Classes. Blackwell.

Parsons, J. (2007). Theories of Location. Oxford Studies in Metaphysics 3:201-32.