Cotnoir And Varzi Mereology

Aaron Cotnoir and Achille Varzi, Mereology, Oxford University Press, 2021, 405pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198749004.

Reviewed by Daniel Nolan, University of Notre Dame


This long-awaited book is a gem. It is a comprehensive survey of the state of the art in the theory of parts and wholes, particularly as work on that topic is carried on in philosophy and logic. Mereology remains both an important topic in metaphysics and a source of tools used for work on questions about the world besides those that are narrowly about parts and wholes, including puzzles about identity, location, space and time, possibility and indeterminacy. But as the authors also note, questions about parts and wholes play an important role in many other areas of philosophy, "including logic, philosophy of language, and the foundations of mathematics" (p xi). The use of mereological tools and systematic theories of parts and wholes also are found beyond philosophy, such as computer science, linguistics and psychology. An up-to-date resource setting out the state of play in contemporary mereology will be valuable to many more researchers than those interested in mereology for its own sake.

This is a work that is clear, careful, and judicious. It will be inevitably compared with Peter Simons's Parts: A Study in Ontology (Simons 1987), which has been a central introduction and reference for mereology for thirty-five years. Mereology will occupy the place once occupied by Parts, both as a technical resource and a one-stop shop for the philosophical motivations for mereological systems. A great deal has happened in mereology in the last third of a century, and Cotnoir and Varzi's encyclopedic work is now the place to get an overview of it all. One advantage Simons's work retains over Cotnoir and Varzi's is that Simons offers a more gentle introduction to mereology. While a novice could teach herself mereology from Cotnoir and Varzi's book, each chapter wades into deep waters quickly.

The book has six chapters as parts. The first short chapter is a discussion of how mereology has been conceived of in philosophy, and while it contains a brief potted history it is clear that the focus is on theoretical rather than historical questions. The second chapter presents Classical Extensional Mereology, still the departure point for many discussions of parts and wholes. (Like many departure points, it is a theory that many or even most writers have some disagreement with!) The third chapter discusses a range of principles about the parthood relation (or perhaps the family of parthood relations), including, for example, the question of whether parthood is transitive, and what sense we are to make of the common view that some things, or all things, are parts of themselves.

Chapter 4 discusses decomposition, and a dizzying array of decomposition and supplementation principles. One approach to mereology that has been growing in popularity is to de-emphasise the idea of starting with some objects and asking what wholes they make up, and instead to start with a complex whole and ask what parts it has, or can be "decomposed" into. Supplementation principles can be thought of as falling in the middle between decomposition and composition questions: given a whole and a proper part of it, what conditions will other proper parts of the whole meet? A full account of mereology should help us with all three kinds of questions, of course, but it is welcome to see questions about decomposition and supplementation share the stage with more traditional questions about composition. Next is a chapter on questions about composition, including traditional topics such as the existence or not of a mereological universe, and what principles of fusion should be adopted; but also topics like composition as identity and whether there is "junk", objects which collectively form larger and larger wholes without ever all summing together. A final chapter, titled "Logic", discusses issues like the interaction of mereology with higher order quantification, and also some other connections between mereology and other topics, such as time, modality and indeterminacy.

The book provides an interesting snapshot not just of the results and arguments that have been published in mereology, but also of the kinds of questions philosophers employing mereology have been keen to answer. The traditional project of using mereology as a nominalistically respectable alternative to set theory is no longer a central part of the conversation. As I noted above, work on decomposition questions has greatly increased in recent decades. There has been a lot of work done in metaphysics on the interaction of mereological principles with questions about location, or identity, or modality, or set theory, and so on. Finally, a thread running through the whole work is attention to methodological questions about mereology. What, if anything, is a conceptual truth here? How do controversial cases bear on general principles and vice versa? To what extent are metalogical features like decidability or completeness desirable? Might mereological principles be domain specific, or should we be trying to formulate completely general mereological laws? Cotnoir and Varzi are not dogmatic about how we should answer these questions, but the presence of these questions throughout the discussion is welcome.

While the book offers an interesting and engaging tour of mereological topics, for many readers the primary value of this work will be as a reference manual. One of the particularly valuable features of the work, considered as a reference resource, is that does a good job of giving references to relevant literature right away in footnotes, giving researchers springboards into the literature with little fuss. The standard symbolism throughout, together with a coherent set of labels of principles, will also help unify disparate contemporary discussions, especially as the authors provide information about what others have called these principles. Proliferation of symbols and labels is a near-unavoidable fact of life for any technical field, and the mereological literature was getting to the point where a cleanup was needed. If authors can point readers to the labels Cotnoir and Varzi use for principles, that should make things easier for the next decade or two at least.

The 82-page bibliography is to be commended as well as a comprehensive list of works onĀ  contemporary mereology in English in recent times, as well as some non-English works. (It does not claim to be complete, however, even for recent English-language publications.) It is also useful as a starting point for exploring the history of mereology, including the contemporary secondary literature on historical works.

It is hard to find any omissions to complain about in this work. Among contemporary debates, the literature on parts and time received relatively little attention, compared to the amount of attention devoted to that topic by Simons 1987. The discussion of mereology in non-classical logical frameworks is also less detailed than I would have hoped for, with most of it integrated into their presentation of approaches to the interaction of indeterminacy and parthood.

One thing that would have been on my wishlist in a completely comprehensive treatment of mereology would be a detailed discussion of the history of theories of parts and wholes. Such a history would need a book the same size again as the current work, so the authors are not to be faulted for focusing on mereology itself rather than its history. A detailed history of mereology would be valuable for several reasons. While the pre-twentieth century history of this topic is fascinating, even a history from the late nineteenth century would bring out why today's questions have the shape they do, and why some have thought that mereology is such an important part of our most general theory of the world. It would also be an interesting angle to approach formal and philosophical developments across the twentieth and twenty-first centuries. We can hope that the authors or other mereologists may one day provide us with a survey of the history of mereology as comprehensive as this works' survey of the contemporary state of the art.

This is a must-have work, not just for those primarily concerned with mereology, but for anyone who finds the theory of parts and wholes relevant for their thinking. Cotnoir and Varzi have done the profession a great service. This book will serve as the new standard and touchstone for work in mereology for decades to come.


Thanks to Jc Beall, Sara Bernstein and Kris McDaniel for comments and discussion.


Simons, P. 1987. Parts: A Study in Ontology. Oxford: Clarendon.